Demystifying Legal Reasoning

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Larry Alexander and Emily Sherwin, Demystifying Legal Reasoning, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 253pp., $26.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521703956.

Reviewed by Dan Priel, University of Warwick


1. Had Felix Cohen seen the title of the new book by Larry Alexander and Emily Sherwin (A&S), he would surely have been quite disappointed. Commenting on some court decisions he said that "Judicial reasoning in this field is … entirely mythical and the actual motivation of courts in reaching given decisions is effectively concealed, from all true believers in the orthodox legal theology" (Felix S. Cohen, "Transcendental Nonsense and the Functional Approach," Columbia Law Review 35 (1935): 809-49, 818). That in 2008 there would still be a need for "demystifying" legal reasoning would surely have come as an unpleasant surprise. And all the more so given that the demystification consisted of a thesis so eminently plausible, so seemingly obvious as the one advanced in Demystifying Legal Reasoning. For A&S's basic contention is that "legal reasoning is ordinary reasoning applied to legal problems" (3). Who could argue with that? After all, despite the occasional suggestion to the contrary, lawyers are human too, so it is hard to see why they would reason any differently from everyone else.

The probable reason such an argument is required is that one still occasionally hears that more than anything else, what one learns in law school is a new way of thinking about problems. What could this possibly mean? "Nothing," is probably the answer A&S would give. In their clear and comprehensive new book A&S argue that, appearances to the contrary notwithstanding, when analyzing legal reasoning we see that it is no different from decision-making in other areas. The first part of their book is dedicated to expounding this view which they dub "ordinary reason applied to law" (31).

For A&S ordinary reasoning consists of exactly three elements: moral reasoning, which they understand along the lines of what Rawls called "reflective equilibrium" (32); empirical reasoning, which involves "gathering data and testing hypotheses" (34), and which A&S say takes a more central role in the creation of new rules than in dispute resolution; and deduction from authoritative rules. The first two elements of reasoning together make up what A&S call "the natural model" which directs legal decision-makers to resolve disputes by making in each case afresh what they consider to be the all-things-considered best decision in the particular case. Adding rule following to the natural model turns it into what they call "the rule model," which demands that judges follow legal rules when such rules exist (even though this necessarily means following them when doing so would lead to suboptimal outcomes in certain cases), and resorting to moral and empirical reasoning only when there is no law governing the case at hand (40). As A&S stress, in practice the differences between the models may not be so stark as they first seem, because even under the natural model judges will have reason to look back to past decisions and often follow them. Nonetheless, the models are not identical: in the natural model the legal past provides data for better decision-making, and may perhaps be taken into account in cases in which past behavior created (justified) expectations. As such past decisions may affect what counts as the correct decision in a given instance, but they never compel the judge to decide a case in a way she considers wrong.

After presenting the two models A&S compare them based on their estimation of which model would lead to the lowest "sum of moral errors" (43). This is essentially an empirical question, and though A&S provide no empirical data to support their view, they do offer some considerations suggesting the superiority of the rule model. I have no means of examining these arguments here, and in any case, they are not the focus of A&S's arguments. Even though at times they say that rules are "necessary for effective settlement of moral and practical controversy" (15), if presented with convincing evidence that contradicted their conclusions, I believe they would endorse the natural model. This result would still be consistent with their "demystification" thesis. Because they are more concerned with arguing for this thesis, they spend less time explicating the different elements of reasoning -- their discussion on empirical reasoning, for example, occupies less than a page -- or the differences between the natural and the rule model, and quite a bit more on refuting the suggestions that there might be something else to legal reasoning.

Before I discuss these arguments, I must say something about A&S's view on reasoning, since they adopt a rather narrow definition of the term. I believe this is a significant issue, because this choice may be thought to favor the conclusions they eventually reach. A&S explicitly limit the scope of their argument to "conscious, language-based deliberation" (10), what psychologists call System 2. In fact, they don't just limit themselves to deliberate reasoning. On occasion they claim that intuitive decision-making is not reasoning at all: resolution of cases by analogy is "purely intuitive and therefore unreasoned and unconstrained" (234; to the same effect 72). Perhaps because they focus on "deliberation" they also assess the quality of reasoning by the normative standards of logic, not those of human psychological capacities.

None of this is obvious, and I think ultimately these starting points undermine A&S's arguments. It is not just that conscious reasoning depends on unconscious reasoning (see Philip Johnson-Laird, How We Reason (2006), chs. 4-5; John A. Bargh & Tanya L. Chartland, "The Unbearable Automaticy of Being," American Psychologist 54 (1999): 462-79), and the relationship between the two is complex and reciprocal. It is also that the seemingly methodological choice to focus just on deliberation rules out rather than addresses a powerful criticism of the rule model. One of the criticisms made by some legal realists already in the 1920's (and one that in some form is still heard today) is that the explicit, deliberative, language-based component of judicial decision-making is only an ex post facto rationalization of a decision that already had been made intuitively (see, among others, Joseph C. Hutcheson, "The Judgment Intuitive: The Function of the "Hunch" in Judicial Decision," Cornell Law Quarterly 14 (1928): 274-88). Views like these are increasingly popular among psychologists, at least outside law (see Jonathan Haidt, "The Emotional Dog and Its Rational Tail: A Social Intuitionist Approach to Moral Judgment," Psychological Review 108 (2001): 814-34), but if we take A&S's view that legal reasoning is no different from ordinary reasoning, then we would expect something similar to be true of law as well, in which case we would have reasons to doubt the validity of the rule model.

The legal realists' work is also relevant for understanding the role of logic in assessing reasoning. Following Holmes's clarion call that "The life of the law has not been logic; it has been experience" (O.W. Holmes, The Common Law (1881), 1), many of the legal realists writing in the 1930's tried to incorporate psychological models prominent in their days into their analyses of judicial work. Jerome Frank was influenced by psychoanalysis; other legal realists such as Walter Wheeler Cook opted for behaviorism. Both approaches are less popular today, but I think the legal realists were right to recognize the relevance of psychology to understanding reasoning, including legal reasoning. (Similar ideas can be found in much contemporary naturalistic epistemology.) By contrast, A&S's account of legal reasoning assesses reasoning by the standards of logic. This leads, as we shall see, to their negative assessment of certain modes of reasoning. It is also implicit in their positive argument, in which the centerpiece of their preferred rule model is deductive reasoning. They say all this even though it is not clear whether deductive reasoning plays a significant role in human reasoning at all. See Mike Oaksford & Nick Chater, "Commonsense Reasoning, Logic, and Human Rationality," in Renée Elio (ed.), Common Sense, Reasoning, and Rationality (2002): 174-214; also John Dewey, "Logical Method and Law," Cornell Law Quarterly 10 (1924): 17-27, 21. This claim, which at first sight seems rather strange, is in fact something lawyers are quite familiar with as oftentimes when faced with a conclusion that follows deductively from certain premises, they reject one of the premises instead of accepting the conclusion, especially when it challenges a strongly held belief. In this lawyers are, of course, not alone: J.St.B.T. Evans et al., "On the Conflict Between Logic and Belief in Syllogistic Reasoning," Memory & Cognition 11 (1983): 295-306.

If we accept the second argument, then A&S's distinction between the natural model and the rule model collapses; if we accept the first, then A&S should have focused on explaining exactly the opposite of what they did: the unconscious aspect of reasoning, not the deliberative one. By concentrating on "language-based deliberation" some would think that they focus on the pointless, perhaps even pernicious, exercise of legal rationalization, not on actual legal reasoning. None of what I have said shows that A&S's conclusions are necessarily wrong; but it shows that the implicit assumptions underlying their arguments are far from obvious, and that if those assumptions are rejected, they would lead someone, who like them thinks legal reasoning is no different from ordinary reasoning, to quite different conclusions.

2. I come now to the part of A&S's argument that may seem the most radical implication of their "ordinary reasoning" approach, for A&S argue that it follows from their view that some well-known staples of legal reasoning -- analogical reasoning, distinguishing past cases, and deciding by following legal principles -- "are illusory" (104). (In what follows I will call these "the contested modes of reasoning.") When considered closely, it appears that A&S advance here two different claims: the first is that the contested modes of reasoning "do not exist" (87) because they are reducible to other modes of reasoning (87, 98, 104, 122-23); the second is that they are "intuitive" and as such they "do[] not constrain the outcome of [a] new case in any predictable or even detectable way" (87).

The first claim shows once again the relevance of the logic-psychology distinction to A&S's discussion. For A&S do not claim that psychologically these modes of reasoning do not exist. If that were their claim it would come as a surprise to many psychologists who have analyzed the role of intuitions, analogical reasoning, and moral principles in "ordinary" reasoning. Their argument against these modes of reasoning is that logically they can be reduced to "natural or deductive reasoning" (104). But while this may be true in a purely logical analysis, this does not undermine the relevance of discussing these decision-making procedures: because such decision-making procedures may be affected by certain biases (see Amos Tversky, "Features of Similarity," Psychological Review 84 (1977): 327-52), or because our limited minds do not always perceive all the logical implications of our beliefs, it may be that in real-life these modes of reasoning would tend to yield conclusions that are different from those arrived at by other means.

This takes us to A&S's second claim, which may be understood as a rejection of exactly this last point: in this guise the claim that the contested modes of reasoning are illusory is that they do not impose any constraint on decision-making. But this view of reasoning is problematic. First, though A&S take it for granted that moral reasoning in the form of reflective equilibrium is a genuine mode of reasoning, it is not clear that it is so if the mark of real reasoning is the capacity to "constrain": similar arguments to the ones they have made against legal principles as constraints have been made against reflective equilibrium (Joseph Raz, "The Claims of Reflective Equilibrium," Inquiry 25 (1982): 307-30). If legal principles do not constrain, it is not clear why moral principles should be all that different, especially as Ronald Dworkin, whose model of legal principles is the object of their critique, has explicitly analogized his model of legal principles and their role in legal reasoning to Rawls's notion of reflective equilibrium in the moral domain (see Ronald Dworkin, Taking Rights Seriously (rev. ed., 1978), 159-68). Second, the view that the mark of reasoning is constraint seems inconsistent with the claim discussed above that the contested modes of reasoning are actually examples of accepted modes of reasoning: if the latter are genuine examples of reasoning, then by A&S's lights it must be because they are capable of constraining legal decisions. If the contested modes of reasoning are reducible to the genuine modes of reasoning, they must be equally constraining.

All this raises the question why A&S consider the capacity to constrain a mark of reasoning. The answer is that constraints seem to have the power to affect the outcomes of cases that but for the constraint judges would have been disposed to decide differently. On this view unless law is shown to be capable of constraining in this way, it cannot serve any role in practical reasoning. But again, it seems to me that A&S are too wedded to a logical model of deduction that produces unique, possibly logically verifiable, conclusions. This explains why A&S do not consider the contested modes of reasoning as examples of legal reasoning, even though they accept that they may "narrow the pool of eligible precedent rules" (125). Even if that is all they did, this would, I believe, be a significant claim that would justify considering them genuine modes of reasoning. But I think we can go further than that: once we realize that we cannot easily limit reasoning to explicit deliberation, we have room for recognizing the ways reasoning may constrain which are different from the one A&S presuppose. It is the constraint supplied by legal rules which makes certain options more salient, more "intuitive," obvious, or even inevitable. Making certain conclusions more intuitive need not make them, as A&S put it, "unreasoned and unconstrained" (234); rather, it can make them reasoned and constrained in a different but real way.

Of course, that these are genuine modes of reasoning tells us nothing about a different question, viz. whether the contested modes of reasoning are good modes of reasoning. In the language adopted above, it might be argued that though these modes of reasoning are constraining, they impose poor constraints: they eliminate too many good choices and do not eliminate enough bad ones. This may or may not be the case (Gerd Gigerenzer, Gut Feelings (2007), for example, is a very sympathetic account of intuitive judgments), but this turns the question of relying on the contested modes of reasoning into something altogether different from the one discussed by A&S. The issues raised by this question are complex, in part because they depend on what counts as a good decision and what counts as a good decision-making process. I am not sure whether what counts as the best decision in, say, the scientific context necessarily counts as the best decision in the legal or political context. (I cannot discuss the matter any further here, but for some preliminary discussion see Danny Priel, "Thinking Like a Lawyer," Journal of Legal Education 57 (2007): 579-99, 588-90.) Be that as it may, to argue for or against the value of the contested modes of reasoning in decision-making is to presuppose their existence as genuine modes of reasoning, which is what A&S deny. This is why it was somewhat surprising to read A&S's arguments against following legal principles (98-100), and even more so their arguments in favor of analogical reasoning and distinguishing past decisions for their ability "to improve the quality of judicial rules" (118), of all-too-human judges who suffer from certain psychological limitations (109-14). It is not a surprise, however, if one believes that the contested modes of reasoning may be examples of genuine forms of psychologically messy yet very ordinary reasoning.

Moreover, if this claim is true, then there may be something unique to legal reasoning: not in the sense of employing some fanciful modes of reasoning special to lawyers, but by making particular use of certain modes of reasoning (such as analogical reasoning) and avoiding others (such as certain kinds of empirical reasoning). What one learns in law school then is that in one's capacity as lawyer one ought to limit one's reasoning to a narrow range of considerations and methods of inference, because those are deemed to be (for whatever reason) uniquely appropriate for legal subject-matters, or for judicial decision-making. Whether or not we think this view is correct, holding it involves no mystification.

3. A central plank of the rule model is that there are rules to follow. Naturally, following the rules requires knowing their content. The second half of A&S's book is concerned entirely with this question. In this part A&S defend the following three propositions: (a) following a rule requires knowing what the rule means; (b) knowing what a rule means requires knowing what its authors intended to convey in expressing it; and (c) only the activity of discovering the intentions of speakers is interpretation: anything that goes beyond the explication of a rule's meaning by means of discovering the intention of its speakers amounts to changing the rule or replacing it with a new one (which may be the same thing) (138). Here, as in the previous part of the book, A&S believe their view captures the ordinary sense of meaning and interpretation (132, 133).

A&S give many examples aimed to convince us that the meaning of expressions is what their authors intended to say. First, they tell us that speech (I include by this word any form of communication) is an intentional activity; when intentionality is absent there is no meaning: an accidental sand formation that looks like the word "cat" is meaningless. Further, they tell us that meaning depends on the intentional choice of language by the speaker; otherwise, the same word can be ambiguous ("canard", as A&S point out, has a different meaning in French and in English). They also give many examples of speech "infelicities" and malapropism aimed to convince us that it is the intended message and not its failed execution that we care about (133-35). After considering and dismissing several well-known challenges to their position (e.g., that in multi-person parliaments it is unlikely that we will find any unified meaning, 171-73) they consider several competing approaches to statutory and constitutional interpretation ("originalism," "textualism," "dynamic interpretation" etc.), and argue against all of them with various degrees of vehemence (191-219).

This part of the book raises many issues I cannot comment on here, but on the central points I did not find A&S's arguments convincing because I don't think they address the most serious challenges to their position. Most fundamentally, their argument seems to be self-defeating: By their own light the word "meaning" can only mean what they say it does if speakers intend to convey that content when they use it. But this is an empirical question. True, there are occasions on which it is plausible to assume that this is what people intend when they use the word "meaning," and the many examples A&S give may be read as empirical evidence showing exactly this. But it is difficult to generalize from such examples: literary theorists could provide a host of examples in which the word "meaning" is used with little regard for authors' intentions. A&S would surely reply that what these theorists are doing is not looking for the meaning of the text, regardless of what they say they are doing. But they cannot make such an argument: if what literary theorists mean when saying "meaning" is not intended speech, then at least for them the word "meaning" does not mean what they say it does.

Additional examples are provided by cases of failure to convey an intended message: if I say "cat" and intend by it the entire United States Constitution, then according to A&S this is the meaning of my word. A&S consider such a challenge and bite the bullet (199), but I doubt their view represents what most people understand the meaning of "meaning" to be. It seems to me that most people would say that though the speaker intended to say something, she failed and her words mean something else. The examples of slips of the tongue that they provide (for instance, saying "autobahn" when meaning ottoman), which are aimed to show how intentions trump utterance, hardly help their case. Such examples are entirely consistent with a plausible theory of utterance meaning, which would recognize the possibility of errors of this sort, and would allow for charitable emendations in order to guarantee intelligibility where without them the sentence would be nonsensical or absurd. The relevant test for their claim, therefore, is a case in which the slip of the tongue produces a meaningful, plausible sentence; and in such a case it is not at all clear that most people would take the "meaning" of the sentence to be the intended information and not the one conveyed by the words. If I say "turn right" intending to say "turn left", it is plausible to say that the meaning of what I said is turn right, regardless of my intentions. If I am right about this, it shows that at least as far as language use is concerned the word "meaning" has multiple meanings; and what we need then is an argument in favor of preferring one meaning over others, at least in the legal context.

My concern is not just about the language use; it is also about the theory of mind and language A&S's views presuppose. They purport to defend their position by showing that intended meaning is more fundamental than other senses of meaning: "utterance meaning is wholly derivative of speaker's meaning and merely reports what most speakers mean by a certain string of marks of sounds" (134). They argue along similar lines that pure textualism is impossible because the meaning words have necessarily depends on certain intentions held by the speaker (such as which language to speak) (192-99).

A&S seem to move from examples that show that speech is an intentional activity, to the conclusion that "Speaker's meaning -- what speakers intend to convey by [a] sign -- is always the independent variable" (134). But this picture, though seemingly intuitive, is questionable, because it misunderstands the way we come to use words. Contrary to A&S's suggestion, we do not simply have "pure" ideas in our heads that we then try to convey to the world using words; rather, our thoughts are already formed in words, which have meanings which we "take" (rather than "make") and are out of our control. (For more see Daniel C. Dennett, Consciousness Explained (1991), ch. 8.)

All this, I think, reveals a more plausible way of solving some of the puzzles A&S encounter. Thus, they argue that if a legislator says "no bears in the park" she means by this all bears, including kinds of bears she has never heard of (142). They argue that this is because the legislator "intended" (142) this; and at other times they endorse as the test of intention what legislators would have answered "if asked how the rule was intended to apply" (171). But while many would agree with A&S's conclusion, this need not be because we think that this is what the legislators intended. Rather, the reason is that when one engages in the intentional activity of speaking (intending, that is, to use a certain word), the meaning of what one says is, at least in part, determined by what "most speakers" understand by the words used, whether or not this conforms with the speaker's intentions.

This point leads to what I think is the most serious challenge to A&S's view. We can hear a parrot emitting sounds and understand them, even though the parrot does not intend to convey a message with those sounds; elephants have been trained to paint ( (cf. 198), and we can definitely make sense of those paintings even though they are probably "meaningless" by A&S's standards. We can look at cloud or sand formations and read them, even if they have been randomly created by natural forces. To explain such cases A&S acknowledge that next to "meaning" as "intended message" there are other, coherent concepts, for example, what they call "utterance meaning" (134), which is why they concede that certain versions of textualism may be plausible (205; also 141).

A&S must now face the question: how do they know that what judges are supposed to do is look for a sentence's "meaning" and not its "utterance meaning"? If, as seems to be the case, the word "meaning" as used by common speakers is ambiguous between these different senses, then explicating one sense does nothing to tell us what the law asks judges to look for. This remains an open question even if we are convinced by A&S's arguments about the meaning of "meaning" and "interpretation." From the other direction, if, as A&S claim, "we care what the actual speakers intend that we do" (139), we care about this whether or not this is captured by the meaning of what they say.

If we can identify several distinct senses of the word "meaning," the question is not which is the right one, but which judges should focus on. On this view different theories of statutory interpretation are not competing on the right understanding of "meaning" and "interpretation" but are rather competing arguments on whether it would be better for judges to interpret rules in order to find their meaning, or to interpret* rules in order to find their meaning* (or, for that matter, meaning**, meaning*** and so on). I don't think any of A&S's arguments I considered so far have bearing on this question. The answer to this, political, question is difficult, and there are all kinds of arguments that would favor asking judges to try and identify what I called the utterance meaning of rules and not their meaning (e.g., the "rule of law" considerations that A&S discuss at 205-07) as well as arguments in favor of looking for legislators' intentions. A&S recognize this possibility (176), and ironically, their own analysis of the different models of reasoning in the first half of the book may give us additional reasons to prefer utterance meaning to meaning: If we believe that the rule model is preferable to the natural model, we need to make sure that legal rules create genuine constraints on judges. It is exactly because legislators' intentions are often such a poor source for constraint for the judges (because they are absent, conflicting, vague, or hard to discern), that we might consider it better for judges to opt for what might be called "utterance interpretation" and not A&S's interpretation.

Even if we wish to adopt the rule model, following A&S's views on interpretation may lead us to the natural model. For example Charles C. Mann and Mark L. Plummer report (in Noah's Choice: The Future of Endagered Species (Knopf, 1995), 161) that few Congressmen had the "foggiest idea" what they were voting for when they voted for the Endangered Species Act. Given the volume of legislation in many modern states, there are good reasons to think that this is not an exception, but rather (excuse the pun) the rule. Now, even if all legislators supporting the Act had identical favorable intentions to "do something" for the protection of endangered species, it does not follow that they had any (or similar) beliefs on what the Act's many sections mean or how they would apply in individual cases. In A&S's view without such an agreement the statute may lack meaning (143 & n.22, cf. 147, 173). If the statute does lack meaning, A&S's model seems to suggest that judges should then opt for moral and empirical reasoning, according to their natural model (170). The result may be that a view that was intended to constrain judges because they are poor rule makers (117) may end up insufficiently constraining. By contrast, even though the statute may have no meaning as understood by A&S, it may well still have utterance meaning (or what lawyers call "plain meaning"). In fact, at least some proponents of certain versions of textualism justify their choice exactly by the fact that it limits the need for rule creation by the courts. Such an approach also shows the potential for additional approaches beyond the natural and rule model proposed by A&S: Even if we believe that judges should first try to follow rules by finding their meaning (as understood by A&S), failing that we need not necessarily ask them to become policy experts, but rather may still ask them to try and identify rules' utterance meaning, plain meaning etc. before turning to legislation.

4. Let me conclude: I am very sympathetic to A&S's project. Against the romantic but totally unsupported view that when we enter the law we leave behind us all our human failings A&S adopt a much more realistic view. Anyone still swayed by the misty-eyed view should read Demystifying Legal Reasoning for a powerful antidote. Most of my disagreements with the book ultimately stem from thinking that A&S have not gone far enough. Psychological research on ordinary reasoning vindicates as genuine many of the forms of reasoning they denounce. Similar comments can be made about their arguments on meaning and interpretation. The alternative picture may be less tidy than the one found in A&S's book, but it is in no way mystical.