Departing From Frege: Essays in the Philosophy of Language

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Sainsbury, R.M., Departing From Frege: Essays in the Philosophy of Language, Routledge, 2002, 256pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415272556.

Reviewed by Dean Buckner, unknown


The title both masks and reflects the problem inside. Once (as Ivor Grattan-Guinness has argued) there was a mathematician who wrote in German, whose preoccupation with founding mathematics on a Platonic theory of meaning “rules him out as a founder of the Anglo-Saxon tradition of analytic philosophy of this century”1 . Later, there was a philosopher of language and the founder of the Analytic Tradition, to whose development the “massive Frege industry” is devoted. The central theme of Mark Sainsbury’s book is a departure from Frege by means of a “pared down Fregeanism”. But which Frege is Sainsbury paring down, and which are the parts is he paring?

Frege the mathematician held that proper names signify objects directly. Indeed, he transformed logic by introducing proper names. In traditional logic, proper names were represented as common nouns, “Venus is a planet” being written as “every Venus is a planet”2 . Frege showed that proper and common names are fundamentally different. A proper name signifies or refers to (bezeichten, bedeuten) an object such as Venus, a predicate signifies a concept. A sentence such as “Venus is a planet” is about (von, wovon) a particular object, saying of it that it satisfies3 a certain Concept, of being a planet. Proper names and predicates stand to objects in quite different ways: a predicate indirectly, via the Concept that the Object satisfies, a proper name directly, by signifying or referring to the Object. It is fundamental to Fregean logic that proper names cannot be empty in the sense that predicates are empty. We can say “there are no planets” but not “there is no Venus”4 .

The word “planet” has no direct relation at all to the Earth, but only to a concept that the Earth, among other things, satisfies; thus its relation to the Earth is only an indirect one, by way of the concept; and the recognition of this relation of falling under requires a judgment that is not in the least already given along with our knowledge of what the word “planet” means.5

This notion was of fundamental importance to the development of logic and mathematics, leading to the ideas of an element, of a set, of the membership relation between element and set, and of empty and infinite sets6 .

By contrast, Frege the philosopher held that proper names do not signify objects directly. We can report what is said by the use of an empty name using a subordinate or “that” clause, therefore such clauses and their constituents must signify their own meaning or sense (Sinn). Proper names signify Objects indirectly, via their sense. This aspect of Frege’s work had almost no influence on the development of mathematics, though it had a great impact on philosophy when it was rediscovered in the 1950’s.

The two positions: (i) that proper names signify objects directly and cannot be empty, and (ii) that they have a “sense” or meaning, even when empty, are difficult to reconcile. Practically all contemporary opinion assumes (for good reason) that they are incompatible. Yet, in this interesting and challenging book, Sainsbury has taken both as a starting point. We are not forced to choose between them (p.19). The distinction between descriptive terms and proper names is fundamental. But a proper name can be empty: there can be “sense without reference” (Essay XII). There is an “overlooked option”.

It is not wholly clear what the option is. The book consists of 12 essays written over more than twenty years (during which it is uncertain that Sainsbury always held the view advocated here). They are not significantly changed, and it is sometimes difficult to discern the thread. I summarise it here.

The book is dominated by the puzzle of how empty singular terms can be intelligible. Sainsbury is clearly struck with an analogy between empty predicates and empty proper names. Asserting “John is happy” commits me to the truth of John’s being happy and commits me to “John” having a referent no less than it commits me to “happy” having a satisfier.

We can use a predicate with no satisfiers to state serious truths, like that there is no round square (Frege 1895: 227), but the same goes for names: there is no such heavenly body as Vulcan. (p. 13)

But is there an analogy? On the early Fregean view, a predicate is empty because the Concept it signifies is empty. For the analogy to hold there must be empty Objects! Sainsbury argues (following Burge, 1974) that successful reference is just satisfaction “under a condition”7 , namely the condition of being the Object signified. The name “Venus” signifies x if and only x is Venus. The first problem is that this was not Frege’s view. The entire point of the distinction between proper and common nouns is to distinguish propositions in which one concept is “subordinated” (untergeordnet) to another, for example

{x: x is a planet} ⊂ {x: x is a heavenly body}

from propositions where an object is subsumed or falls under (fällt unter) a concept:

Venus ε {x: x is a planet}

It is pointless, therefore, to symbolise “Venus” as “{x: x = Venus}”. The insistence on the distinction between ε and the relation of part and whole between classes symbolised by ⊂ is due to Frege and underpins the whole technical development of set theory8 . It is essential to almost everything that Frege wrote. In departing from this, there is nothing in Frege we would be departing from.

With a concept the question is always whether anything, and if so what, satisfies it. With a proper name such questions make no sense.9

The second problem is that we still need to say that Venus satisfies the concept of being Venus. What does “Venus” signify? If the Object, the game begins again: proper names signify directly. If not, the distinction between a set and its members collapses10 . We cannot depart from the founder of modern mathematics in this way, without abandoning him entirely.

Still, Sainsbury provides compelling arguments. Our natural view (Essay XII) is that an empty name is intelligible, so having a referent is not part of its semantics. A semantic theorist need not be an astronomer, “which he would have to be to distinguish “Neptune” from “Vulcan”; nor a theologian, which he would have to be to determine which, if any, of his subjects’ names for gods are empty” (p. 209), and so on. “Semantic theory is one thing, specialist knowledge of non-semantic fact another”. If a word like “Homer” is empty, how can semantic theory have nothing to say about it?

There are well-known objections, but there are convincing replies (Essays VIII, IX, XII). We can report the content of what is uttered using an empty name11 . Le Verrier said that there was a planet called “Vulcan” and said that Vulcan orbited between Mercury and the Sun. Reporting what is said using empty names makes perfect sense. Otherwise there would be nothing to report:

Suppose the story-teller says “And then Alice came to the dragon’s cave, and said the magic formula the friendly genie had given her, and which no human ear could understand: “erty uiop asd”. The dragon heard and realised he was not to attack Alice”.

We can pretend that the dragon’s sounds were meaningful, but we cannot report what he said, using those very sounds. We cannot even pretend to report nonsense12 using a “that” clause.

Another objection, due to Kripke, is that name-using practices start with a baptism and so connect the use of a proper name to the baptised object. Sainsbury’s reply (Essay XII) is to adopt the Kripkean picture about transmission, while eliminating the object. A “baptism” may be a baptism of nothing: a name can be intelligibly introduced even if it names nothing (p. 212). The causal chain we associate with the use of proper names may begin merely with a “journalistic” source (p. 165). Our practices concerning empty names are portrayed here in detail and depth.

Of course, the intelligibility of empty names is perfectly consistent with a description approach, but Sainsbury also holds that proper names are not “descriptions in disguise”. How can a truly significant expression have no descriptive content and yet signify no object? He presents two lines of argument:

(i) In Essay VII, he builds on the Fregean idea13 that we recognise something common to thoughts that correspond to the same proper name. This is sameness of sense, or “guaranteed sameness of referent”. He defends this against the objection that, absurdly, this presupposes infallible capacities for recognising sameness and difference among senses. Unthinking reliance of sameness of reference underpins our whole system of thought and reasoning. Consider (p. 135)

a = b
:. Fb

In accepting the validity of this argument, we assume that expressions that are the same make the same contribution to validity. But different occurrences of identical expressions may differ in meaning. (This explains the “Paderewksi” problems, he argues14 .) Simply to state that the same person is in question, we must use an identity statement, using fresh tokens of the same expression, one of which we must assume to have the same reference as before. There is no escaping this reliance (p.135). When this identity is guaranteed by what is involved in understanding, the relevant tokens have the same sense. (I am not sure the idea of “same sense” is not redundant. Is it not simply enough to say that the meanings of certain tokens can be such that, whoever grasps them, grasps that they have the same referent, if they have a referent?)

This is consistent with our idea that there is information locked up in a proper name, or in its context of use, that tells us which individual bears it. It is difficult, however, to reconcile with the idea of Essay XII, that the source of a piece of information is in some way essential to its semantics. The source of our information is not usually part of the information itself.

(ii) In essay XX, Sainsbury argues for a kind of a semantic content that is neither straightforwardly descriptive nor referential, because it is non-detachable. Sometimes we are able to report adequately what was said by means of an utterance which is not, as it were, self-standing (p. 141). We are able to split the report of what was said into a scene-setting part such as (my example) “Crusoe got up one day”, then a content-ascribing part “he said they would need to get food that day”, containing terms that are anaphorically dependent on the scene-setting part. In these cases we cannot detach the content-ascribing part from the scene-setting part. We have reported something Crusoe said, but not something that can be adequately expressed independently of context. For example, we cannot replace “on that day” by “on October 26, 1659”. Possibly Crusoe had no idea of the date. Perhaps he just got up one day and said “we must get food today”.

Non-detachability poses a problem for any kind of description theory. The essence of such theories is to attach a specific meaning to all tokens of a certain type (p. 143), by whose means we construct a sentence that has a truth-value “in its own right”. The essence of general terms is that they are in dictionaries, that we learn their meaning as a part of learning a language. The meaning of the word “green” is essentially self-standing. But clearly we cannot explain non-detachable expressions using descriptive semantics. And we cannot explain it by semantic dependence on objects either. If I write, “The King had a sister called ’Matilda’“, my audience is in a position to use the name “Matilda”. Yet the name has been patently introduced on the back of mere existential quantification (p. 149). Grasp of its meaning does not seem to require a semantic relation with any object 15 . Or consider the following, adapted from Sainsbury’s example.

A: The King had a sister
B: I suppose she got married young

Suppose B has no idea who Matilda is. We must regard “she” as anaphoric on A’s use of “a sister”. But if Matilda is present one day later, and I point to her, it would be incorrect to report B as having said that he imagined that princess had got married young.

Even our dependence on physical contexts such as images or sounds to achieve reference can be explained by context-setting. Jane (my example) watches a scene of a man robbing a bank. Later she says, “that man was driving too fast”, where it is clear from the context that she “means” the robber. The role of scenes in a film is analogous to scene-setting remarks, such as “Jane watched a scene of a man robbing a bank”, followed by content-ascribing remark such as “Later she said that the man was driving too fast”. The difference between verbal and visual scene setting is merely accidental, between naturally occurring and deliberately contrived contextual features. If we know what was said, there are always words that will achieve the appropriate scene setting, moreover, in the absence of a physical context (images, sounds) it is only by words that we can do this (p. 149). This essay contains some of the most interesting ideas in the book.

The themes of meaning and compositionality (Essays I, V, X, XI) and reference (Essays VII, VIII, IX, XII) occupy much of the book. There are also two essays on vagueness and boundaries of predication (III, VI). Two are exegetical, on Russell’s theory of descriptions (IV), and a welcome inclusion of his 1984 review of Evans’ seminal work, The Varieties of Reference. There is significant new material in the lengthy introduction

None of this quite addresses the underlying problem, that there cannot be conditions of satisfaction for a referring term. Satisfaction presumes a relation between two objects, the referent of a proper name and the referent of a predicate, and thus presumes that the proper name has a referent. Nevertheless, it is a very good book; if its main argument had not been obscured within a collection of artistically unconnected essays, it might have been a great book. It skirts the sterile debate between “descriptive” and “referential” positions and suggests at least the blueprint for a radically new proper-name semantics. The idea that such a semantics must be blind to the distinction between fiction and other uses seems particularly important. Is it possible that this book will, as Sainsbury said (p. xx) of Evans’ book “be central to discussions of reference and singular thought for years to come”?


1. The Search for Mathematical Roots, 1870-1940, Princeton 2000, p. 177.

2. As a glance at any logic textbook published earlier than about 1890 suggests. See, for example, Ueberweg, System of Logic and History of Logical Doctrines, 1871, § 70 which Frege seems to have read. See also Mill (Logic p. 109), and Kant, Kritik § 9, A71. Frege’s arguments in “On Concept and Object” should be understood as a critique of this forgotten theory.

3. Literally “falling under”, as in das Fallen eines Gegenstandes unter einen Begriff.

4. For example, “Über Begriff und Gegenstand” in Vierteljahresschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16, 1892, S. 192-205, p. 201, transl. as “On Concept and Object”, in Geach & Black 1952 pp. 42-55, p. 50; also “Notes for Ludwig Darmstaedter”, Nachgelassene Schriften p. 274.

5. “A critical elucidation of some points in E. Schroeder’s Vorlesungen Über Die Algebra der Logik”, Archiv fur systematische Philosophie 1895, pp 433-456, p. 454, transl. Geach, in Geach & Black 86-106, p. 105. Sainsbury quotes this piece as though the date of 1895 were significant. In reality, the piece repeats arguments of the Grundlagen (published in 1884), although in a way that throws interesting light upon the development of set theory in the 1890’s.

6. The review of Schroeder (ibid) outlines these connections. See also Russell, Principles of Mathematics, § 21 where he attributes the invention of the set-membership relation to Frege, and sections § 475 to § 496 on “The Logical and Arithmetical doctrines of Frege”.

7. p. 207, see also p. 108.

8. Though the extent of Frege’s direct influence on set theory after 1900 is difficult to determine, his indirect influence via Russell is beyond question.

9. Grundlagen § 51 p.63-4. See also the passage in “On Concept and Object”, where Frege argues that “being (no other than) Venus” really stands for a concept, under which Venus falls, and which is therefore something distinct from Venus. (ibid p. 194, Geach & Black p. 44).

10. Another problem is the Scotist idea of haecceity that this implies. Is there really some sort of property or essence, of being the planet Venus? Is there such a property belonging to Venus, the ancient goddess?

11. As Frege also knew. (“Logic”, Nachgelassene Schriften, p. 141, quoted in Evans p. 29.)

12. Geach, P. Mental Acts, London 1957, p.11.

13. Mentioned in a letter to Philip Jourdain of 1914 (Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel, pp.127-8). If we find the same word in two propositions, we recognise something common to the corresponding thoughts, something corresponding to the word.

14. Kripke, Saul (1979). “A puzzle about belief.” In Margalit, Avishai (eds.) Meaning and Use, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 239-83.

15. His challenge to the distinction between quantification and reference evokes the work of Fred Sommers. See e.g. The Logic of Natural Language, Oxford 1982, p. 82 and passim. The example on p. 147 is similar to one discussed by Sommers and Geach (Reference and Generality, pp. 126-7).