Depicting Deity: A Metatheological Approach

Depicting Deity

Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Depicting Deity: A Metatheological Approach, Oxford University Press, 2021, 224pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192896452.

Reviewed by Georg Gasser, Universität Augsburg


In the philosophical guild, we are familiar with metametaphysical and metaethical questions. Metametaphysics concerns the nature, methodology and presuppositions of metaphysical inquiry. Metaethics deals with the nature, methodology and presuppositions of ethical inquiry. What about metatheology? Apparently, there is no vibrant field of inquiry yet comparable to the two other disciplines mentioned above. This might change, however, as John Kvanvig’s book understands itself explicitly as a metatheological study aiming at exploring largely unchartered territory.

Assume God exists. Then a question that immediately follows is: What is God like? Kvanvig addresses this question by exploring the possibilities regarding the nature of God and what criteria are at hand to examine and compare them in terms of their explanatory strengths and limitations. He identifies three major metatheological alternative accounts which have been historically influential: “Creator Theology” (CT), “Perfect Being Theology” (PBT) and “Worship-Worthiness Theology” (WWT). In addition, he takes into consideration a “catch-all fourth possibility” (34), which is a metatheological anti-fundamentalism (MAF) in the sense that it denies that any of the divine attributes central to the other accounts is fundamental to the divine nature. Instead, what is needed for any substantive theology is a combination of some, or all, of the other three accounts.

So, the basic idea is that each fundamental metatheological alternative has at its center an essential attribute which represents the starting point for any adequate account of the divine nature. CT claims that what is fundamental concerning the divine nature is God’s creative power; PBT says it is divine perfection and WWT points towards praise- and worship worthiness.

Given these fundamental accounts of the nature of God, one can ask: Is there one metatheological account which is able to derive all valuable aspects of the other accounts from its basis? For instance, can CT show that God’s creative power is the basis for God’s perfections and God’s being worthy of worship? Or can PBT explain that God’s creative power and worthiness of worship is a result of God’s perfect nature? Should it become clear that there is no such fundamental account, then resorting to the anti-fundamentalist fourth option is likely the way to go.

Let us take a closer look at each of the three accounts in turn: PBT is the preferred position in contemporary philosophy of religion. The central assumption says that God is maximally perfect or the metaphysically greatest possible entity—“that than which a greater cannot be thought” as Anselm famously put it. According to this account, on a scale of metaphysical value, only that which occupies the highest level can be called God. This scale of values is not subjectively determined by human interests and preferences, but represents objective value which is generally specified in terms of great-making properties such as being perfect in power, knowledge and goodness.

If PBT is the much-discussed position, WWT is perhaps the least-analyzed account. Kvanvig surmises that this might be the case because it is unclear how to distinguish God’s worship-worthiness from that of other praiseworthy entities. Kvanvig’s preferred line of interpretation sees the concept of worthiness of being worshiped as a short-hand “for the idea that what is fundamental to the nature of God is that God is maximally worthy of the most supreme worship, and distinctively so” (30). Thus, worship can be expressed in minimal and maximal forms, but the highest form of worship is only fitting for God. Worshipping God is not only a value good to participate in, but it also represents the most appropriate human attitude towards God. Accordingly, WWT is not only located within a theory of value but it also brings to the fore an obligation concerning how to relate adequately to God.

Let us now turn to CT, the position that occupies the most space in Kvanvig’s study, but which in his eyes has not received the attention it deserves in philosophical theology so far. This may be related to the fact that CT is generally associated with critical considerations of the cosmological and teleological argument. It is well known that philosophers like Hume, Mill and Kant have noted that nature’s expediencies are far from perfect and therefore these arguments at best can demonstrate an imperfect divine demiurge, but not God as the omnipotent, omniscient and morally perfect first cause of the universe. This criticism is epistemologically driven. The present study, however, “is a metaphysical one [. . .], so there is no need to route our discussion through an epistemological lens” (42). Cosmological and teleological considerations, as important as they may be, are to be distinguished from CT as metatheological starting points as the question is not how we might find reasons to believe that a first cause or ultimate designer exists. Rather, the central idea of CT is that God is the asymmetrical source of all that exists and metaphysically independent from all else. Thus, the central features of CT are metaphysical sourcehood and divine aseity.

Now, that the metatheological landscape has been sketched, we can turn to a closer evaluation of the individual positions and examine how much of the classical concept of God can be derived from them. In part II, Kvanvig focuses on the following characteristics: monotheism, personhood and embodiment.

On the first issue, CT has the most obvious advantage. If God is the asymmetrical source of all else, then monotheism follows immediately because no other entity could stand in this relation to all else. PBT and WWT have more difficulties here as PBT’s central claim is that to be God one must be unsurpassably great, and WWT’s central claim is that to be God one must be supremely worthy of the highest form of worship. Neither of these characterizations imply that there is only one God. If one is willing to abandon monotheism, however, this initial advantage of CT over PBT and WWT may become insignificant, especially if PBT and WWT can secure harmony among multiple deities (79). So, the issue of monotheism is less able to bring about a decision between the three accounts than to show that CT ought to be regarded as a serious option.

On the issue of personhood, WWT has an immediate advantage since worshipping is intimately connected with bodily postures such as bowing down or kneeling, thereby displaying an attitude of obedience and surrender. These bodily acts have a communicative function; it is about subordinating oneself to a higher being and acknowledging its exaltation. Although we can praise inanimate objects such as works of art, be in a state of awe and wonder in the presence of an impressive natural phenomenon or even feel reverence and humbleness in front of the vast and infinite universe, none of these attitudes constitutes a communicative act, strictly speaking.

What about PBT and CT? Kvanvig sees here a serious problem for PBT. It is generally assumed that the God of PBT is a person. If, however, the notion of God according to PBT is derived from the concept of great-making properties, then being a person is likely to be a great-making property as well. This leads to the problem that apparently “for any given thing whatsoever, it is better for that thing to be a person than not” (81)—a statement that evokes bewilderment as, for instance, my car would not be a better car if it were a person. If a defender of PBT claims that being a person is great-making only for some entities and not for others, an additional argument is needed for why it is a great-making property for God. So, there is obviously no direct route from great-making properties to personhood. In addition, there is a crucial difference between great-making properties and the property of being a person. The former are properties coming in degrees with a supposed intrinsic maximum whereas the latter is a non-gradable on-off property. Thus, being a person is not the kind of property to rely on when characterizing the divine nature in terms of a perfect being. The upshot of this discussion is that being a person and being an omni-being apparently are two pairs of shoes. PBT seems to have great difficulties in showing that God necessarily is a person.

Next, regarding CT, the move from being the creator of all else to being a personal creator is generally a quick one. The discussion of PBT, however, should have made us cautious. An obvious link in CT is that of sourcehood and power because being the source of all else presupposes having the power to bring all else about. A productive force, however, is not directly linked to the personal divine attributes of knowledge and goodness as a force can be agential or non-agential. Therefore, Kvanvig notes that what “is needed here is an argument that when we are considering the all-inclusive sourcehood definitive of CT, agential sourcehood is required” (84).

One way to explain the relation between a source and the product is to assume the ordered triple <source, link, product> where the link refers to laws of nature. Laws of nature, however, are part of the explanandum, not of the explanans, as they originate from the source as everything else does. So, a non-personal account of CT faces the problem of either leaving the question of the source in the dark or generating a vicious circle. One way of avoiding this difficulty might be to appeal to contingent laws of nature and metaphysical necessary laws which explain contingency as arising from the source. However, these metaphysical laws themselves also have to be explained in terms of this source.

A personal account of CT, instead, has a simple solution to offer. Classical theism holds that the required links are to be found in the mind of God: Contingent truths are sourced in the divine will and non-contingent truths in the operation of the divine mind. A personal source of power can account for this bifurcation between necessity and contingency whereas a non-personal account has nothing to offer but an undifferentiated source of non-agential power. Accordingly, agential versions of CT have “the resources of the right sort for constructing the explanations needed in order to sustain the claim that God is the asymmetrical source of all else” (89)—be it contingent or necessary. Therefore, these versions of CT are able to provide a derivation of personhood which gives them an advantage over PBT.

Finally, let us briefly turn to the question of the embodiment, which is a thoroughly controversial assumption in the context of the doctrine of God, since it is anything but clear to what extent one should attribute a body to God at all, and how we should conceive of this body. Accordingly, Kvanvig tackles this issue with some reserve compared to the other two issues. He notes that a problem regarding the embodiment-thesis arises if we assume that God’s relation to the contingent physical universe is able to generate an inference from features of this universe to attributes of God. The idea is that contingency is a kind of imperfection and if the contingent universe is God’s body (or a part of it), and if the previously mentioned inference holds, then this would imply an imperfection in God as well. PBT and WWT have a direct way to avoid this route and reject the embodiment-thesis as they highlight divine perfection and maximal worship-worthiness respectively. CT does not seem to directly possess such resources which results in a small disadvantage for CT in comparison to its two competitors.

In the subsequent part III of this study, each individual account is examined with regard to its explanatory power in developing the alternative metatheologies from its specific basis. The result of this analysis is rather disappointing as no account shows clear advantages over the others. Therefore, the proper conclusion to draw is that no account has the capacity to fully derive the starting points of its competitors. Nevertheless, a certain ranking can be established in view of the previous considerations which places CT first, ahead of WWT, while PBT falls to third place, as this approach has the greatest difficulty in showing that there is only one God and that this God is a person. This result may come as a surprise as CT is rather a neglected position. This may have to do with the fact that fundamental concepts such as divine aseity and the transcendental ground of all reality are often not analyzed thoroughly enough as theological starting points. In addition, in many theologies, monotheism and the personhood of God are simply presupposed without detailed examination, and it is here that CT shows clear advantages over PBT and WWT.

The finding that none of the three metatheologies is fully convincing may also lead someone to turn to the fourth option—MAF. When someone takes this path, the best version of MAF according to Kvanvig “would seem to be a combination of CT and WWT starting points” (187). CT and this specific version of MAF make it clear that a stringently thought through doctrine of God should think of God’s fundamental nature primarily in terms of the creator of all reality and secondarily in terms of Anselmian perfections.

A final remark since the question of God’s embodiment has only been briefly touched upon by Kvanvig in part II. One way to think of God’s embodiment might not be through physicality but through divine agency: God is there, where God acts. Since God as an agential asymmetrical source of all that exists acts upon everything there is and sustains everything in its existence, God is directly present to everything there is. This omnipresence can be interpreted as a kind of constitution of the divine body because God is in a unique way connected to all of creation. Such an approach is likely to suit CT in a special way and it corresponds well to those theological traditions that think of God as both, fundamentally non-material but intimately connected to the material creation.

This is an admirable book. Kvanvig draws a detailed metatheological map and shows ingeniously the metaphysical presuppositions that come along with it. He defends with rigor what he sees as the most promising metatheological candidates without flippantly disregarding the others. Perhaps others may find the drawn map incomplete or propose to sketch it differently. This is likely to be the general fate of maps that outline a territory for the first time. What is decisive is that the first important step has been made. We have a good overview of a previously largely unchartered territory at hand. Now it is the turn of others to use this map and enrich it with details so that we can find our way towards a proper understanding of the nature of God.