Derrida After the End of Writing: Political Theology and New Materialism

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Clayton Crockett, Derrida After the End of Writing: Political Theology and New Materialism, Fordham University Press, 2017, 183pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823277834.

Reviewed by Vernon W. Cisney, Gettysburg College


I have been a fan of Crockett's work since his 2013 volume, Deleuze Beyond Badiou: Ontology, Multiplicity, and Event (Columbia University Press). So I was ecstatic when given the opportunity to review his most recent book. With this work, Crockett makes a powerful and compelling argument for the ingredients of a 'New Materialism' embedded in Derrida's notion of 'archē-writing,' a materialism that is spiritual without being dualistic, and speaks to contemporary issues of the sciences and ecological thought, areas that have typically been approached via the more Deleuzian wings of contemporary continental philosophy. This book certainly did not disappoint.

For decades, Derrida himself, as well as the body of scholars who have been influenced by his thought, have operated under the lingering cultural haze of the misuses and abuses of Derrida's work, many of which accuse Derrida of some form of 'linguistic idealism.' But given that so much of Derrida's early thinking centers around questions of language, texts, and writing -- 'grammatology,' the 'science of writing,'[1] 'archē-writing,' force as the 'other of language,' etc. -- such misreadings are not easily dismissed. The question remains: if writing does not just mean 'writing,' then what does it mean? Or, put otherwise, are there ways in which Derrida's powerful analyses of archē-writing put his thinking into discussion with today's most pressing questions concerning ecology and the sciences, and if so, how does this connect with Derrida's ongoing reflections on religion and sovereignty? Is there a future of Derrida beyond the question of writing?

Crockett's work offers a most welcome voice in this discussion. While acknowledging that 'Derrida mostly attends to the way that force disrupts language and dislocates meaning' (10), Crockett proposes to read Derrida's concept of 'force' more expansively, bringing it into relation with the more scientific notion of 'energy,' and thus pulling Derrida in a direction that is more ontological and ultimately materialist than many Derrideans would perhaps prefer. His point is not that 'we need to rescue Derrida from this linguistic paradigm, but instead to see how the so-called linguistic paradigm was already a material paradigm . . . ' (8-9). But Crockett's materialism is far more vitalistic than the materialism of the scientific revolution, and endeavors to sidestep the pitfalls of both reductive materialism (the trappings of which made Derrida uncomfortable with the language of 'materialism'), and of dualistic vitalisms as well. Crockett's understanding of energy is multi-faceted and thoroughly dynamic -- even, dare I say, divine. As Crockett writes,

Energy is force, forces, and these forces make us -- they are us. These energy forces are at one and the same time fully material and fully spiritual. Here is where materialism, religion, and politics, including the themes and concerns of political theology, intersect. And Derrida remains one of our most powerful and provocative resources to think about this intersection. (11)

Helping inaugurate what is still but a fledgling body of research on the question of a Derridean materialism, Crockett's text covers tremendous ground, exploring Derrida's concept of 'messianicity without messianism,' his engagements with Christianity, his analyses of the concept of sovereignty, his writings on Paul Celan, and his complex indebtedness to Martin Heidegger. But one of the book's greatest strengths is the mastery that it displays of the body of scholarship beyond Derrida. Crockett develops his 'new materialist' reading of Derrida in conversation with Jean-Luc Nancy's 'deconstruction of Christianity,' Gil Anidjar's critiques of the Christian emphasis on blood, Quentin Meillassoux's 'speculative realism' and its offshoot, 'object-oriented ontology', John Caputo's 'weak theology,' Catherine Malabou's notion of 'plasticity,' and quantum physics via Karen Barad and François Laruelle.

Chapter 1, 'Reading Derrida Reading Religion,' argues that the 'turn' towards religious questions in Derrida's later thought is far more complicated than the language of a 'turn' would suggest; if there is a turn at all, Crockett argues, it is not a repudiation, but rather a further development, of aspects of deconstruction that were already there in the beginning of Derrida's career. We might say that the target of deconstruction in its early development is the 'religiosity' of Western philosophy, 'insofar as it desires pure self-presence in the form of speech or Logos, and it wants to separate and segregate writing as a form of corruption, decay and death' (17). This desire for self-presence (conceptualized as 'God') is constantly disrupted by the structure of what the early Derrida calls 'archē-writing,' the play of force responsible for the 'inscription' of meaning-making -- this vital play of force is synonymous with the Derridean neologism, différance. But already in these early analyses, there is in Derrida's work an emphasis that we can call 'evental,' a concern with the coming of the unforeseeable, highlighted in the ways in which différance both constitutes and disrupts our structures and systems of knowledge. This evental concern is one that, Crockett suggests, contains elements of the religious and the ethical (and it is worth noting that, for Derrida, these two are not radically distinct). These religio-ethical dimensions are on clear display in 1964's 'Violence and Metaphysics,' an essay on Emmanuel Levinas, and in this essay are planted the seeds that would be later developed with far more rigor in such pieces as The Gift of Death, 'The Force of Law,' and 'Faith and Knowledge.' Of particular importance is the phrase, expressing Derrida's evental logic and central to Derrida's later thought, 'tout autre est tout autre': 'every other is wholly other.' Thus the 'turn' in Derrida's thought, if one there is, is not a radical turn, but a further development of ideas that were already present in the early and mid-1960s. For Crockett, the religious dimensions of Derrida's later thought demonstrate quite clearly 'an opening up of deconstruction beyond writing in a narrow, technical sense' (15).

The second chapter, 'Surviving Christianity,' offers an important critical commentary on the recent turf war concerning the legacy of deconstruction, and the extent to which it is or is not bound up with Christianity. The principal interlocutors in this chapter are Nancy and his 'deconstruction of Christianity,' Caputo and his 'religion without religion,' Martin Hägglund and his 'radical atheism,' and Anidjar's hematological critique of Christianity. Citing Marcel Gauchet, Nancy argues that Christianity is the 'religion that leads religion beyond religion' (29). Like the Christian doctrines of the crucifixion and resurrection, the core of Christianity, Nancy claims, is its kenotic self-emptying and self-surpassing. This self-surpassing, in constant questioning of its origins, is deconstructive through and through and likewise characterizes the heart of Western culture, according to Nancy. By acknowledging the complicity of these origins -- deconstruction, Christianity, Western culture -- we participate in this self-surpassing of Christianity. Crockett effectively illuminates Derrida's resistance to the teleological elements of Nancy's understanding of Christianity, as Derrida argues, in an Hegelian vein, that Nancy's hoped-for de-Christianization of the West is likely to be but one more insidious victory for Christianity itself. Some of these insidious transmutations in Christianity's past have been the sublimation, documented by Walter Benjamin, of Christianity into modern capitalism, as well as the metamorphosis, traced by Anidjar, of the Christian emphasis on the pure blood of Christ into the racial/racist categories of modernity. As such, Derrida attempts a much more nuanced and cautious engagement, highlighting in his 1994 'Faith and Knowledge' the two sources of the religious: (1) the experience of belief (or faith); (2) the experience of the sacred or pure. Crockett then traces the inheritance of Derrida's complex relationship to the religious through the opposed works of Hägglund and Caputo, arguing that while Hägglund overemphasizes the second of the two sources, and as such, reads Derrida as positively anti-religious, Caputo offers a more subtle emphasis on the first, pointing toward a religion (faith) without religion (purity), while recognizing the essential complicity and conflictuality of the two.

Chapter 3, 'Political Theology Without Sovereignty,' begins with a discussion of Michael Naas's Miracle and Machine: Jacques Derrida and the Two Sources of Religion, Science, and the Media. These principles, the machinic and the miraculous, are traced by Naas across the whole of Derrida's oeuvre, with the machinic constituting the element of calculation and repetition, and the miraculous occupying the site of the evental irruption of the unforeseeable. Life, for Derrida, is both -- miraculous irruption and mechanical repetition, a kind of 'death-in-life' (44). This dual principle then factors into the theme of sovereignty as it relates to the political sphere. In his 1932 text, The Concept of the Political, Carl Schmitt famously claims that all political concepts amount to secularized theological concepts, and that the essence of the political consists in the sovereign ability to decide/distinguish between friend and enemy. This emphasis on sovereignty, bound up with traditional theistic conceptions of the divine, overlooks the evental element of the decision, the fact that a decision, to be a decision, cannot be the mere repetition or execution of a programmatic formula. There is an element to every decision that comes from we know not where. The very notion of the sovereign 'decision' always deconstructs. But where Schmitt is correct is that there is an irreducibly religious dimension to the political sphere -- this is the element of 'faith' or belief, required of any form of social cohesion. As such, Derrida 'wants to think both democracy and divinity without sovereignty' (51). And though Crockett doesn't draw much attention to this point, Derrida's deconstruction of sovereignty can be traced back to Writing and Difference, and especially to Voice and Phenomenon, both of which are from 1967.

Chapter 4, 'Interrupting Heidegger with a Ram,' analyzes Derrida's reading of Celan, a German-speaking Jewish poet who met briefly with Heidegger at his hut in Todtnauberg. In his 1929 lectures, published as The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, Heidegger, echoing a longstanding philosophical dogma, had outlined 'three guiding theses: "the stone is worldless, the animal is poor in world, man is world-forming"' (67).[2] In much of his later work, Crockett notes, Derrida traces the deconstruction of sovereignty through Heidegger's presupposition that the animal is 'poor in world,' disrupting the assumed privileged status of the human animal. For Derrida, Celan's poetry provides a critical lens to think the animality of the human animal, and thus a sense of world-poverty that makes possible, even necessary, the ethical relation. However, of Heidegger's three theses, and despite the fact that Derrida cites all three as problematic, he focuses only on the two theses concerning man and the animal, but ignores the worldlessness of the stone. Chapter 4 thus serves for Crockett as a transitional chapter, as Celan provides a poetic form of writing that opens avenues of thinking, largely left unexplored, for Derrida.

In Chapter 5, 'Derrida, Lacan, and Object-Oriented Ontology,' Crockett offers insightful exposition and criticism of the strains of contemporary continental philosophy known as 'Speculative Realism' and 'Object-Oriented Ontology', both of which decry what Meillassoux refers to as 'correlationism' -- the assumption, prevalent since Kant, that philosophy must begin in the phenomenological experience of the subject; and both of which seek to respect the ontological specificity of objects. As Crockett rightly argues, whatever one may say about the subjectivism of Kant or Husserl, the poststructuralists, notorious as they are for the 'death of the subject,' are strange targets to critique for radical subjectivism. Crockett further argues that, in their fervor to move from subjects to objects, the theorists of object-oriented ontology largely overlook the ontology of time (a constant and abiding object of analysis among the poststructuralists, in particular Derrida and Deleuze). Crockett then closes out this chapter by further considering Derrida's proclamation -- tout autre est tout autre -- in light of Heidegger's thesis, largely ignored by Derrida -- about the worldlessness of the stone. 'If every other is every other, that does not simply mean all human others who exist in Kantian terms as rational moral beings' (92). What could be more 'other' to us than the stone?

Chapter 6, 'Radical Theology and the Event', further develops Crockett's indebtedness to Caputo's career-long engagement with Derrida's thinking -- an engagement, it is worth noting, that arguably lit up for Derrida a more religiously oriented approach to deconstruction. Crockett argues that, early on, Caputo finds the makings of an evental affirmation in Derrida's thinking, but 'at first more under the influence of a kind of writing, which is why he [Caputo] needs Heidegger, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche to supplement Derrida's philosophy with a more existential affirmation of life' (97). However, Caputo comes to recognize that the evental affirmation in Derrida is already existential, even in his earliest writings. Deconstruction, Caputo holds, is itself the passion for the impossible, for the experience of the impossible. This impossibility is what often passes, in many traditions and cultures, under the name of 'God,' according to Caputo. But traditional religion frequently turns the 'event' into a sovereign and/or a being, a static entity of self-presence, rather than event. Caputo, on the other hand, attempts to think a 'weak theology', focused on a 'God without sovereignty' (101). One of the implications of such a 'weak theology' is the absoluteness of risk -- unlike Hegel, for whom 'there is no chance that God could be blown apart by an infinite bomb' (107), on Caputo's weak theological understanding of God as event, one guise of the unforeseeable is 'the logic of death and utter irreversible extinction' (108).[3] This logic of the impossible opens, for Caputo, new and unforeseeable possibilities for thought and for life.

Chapter 7, 'Deconstructive Plasticity,' engages with the philosophy of Malabou, whose work Crockett sees as providing a more materialist counterpart in Derrida's legacy to the religious reading of Caputo. Malabou thinks in terms of the 'motor scheme,' an image of or approach to thought that best encapsulates and intervenes within an historical and intellectual epoch. On Malabou's understanding, the motor scheme that guides Derrida's work is 'archē-writing'. This motor scheme surfaced under the conditions of the linguistic turn in philosophy as well as the reign of structuralism, and as such, for Malabou, 'archē-writing' went far in the explosion and transformation of our understanding of writing. However, advances in the sciences, in particular in the neurosciences, since then have demonstrated clearly that 'archē-writing' has effectively run its course. In place of archē-writing, Malabou proposes as the current motor scheme, the notion of 'plasticity.' 'Writing cannot explain how the brain works, but plasticity can and does' (111). For Malabou, plasticity involves the 'capacity to receive form and the capacity to give form' (113), but plasticity also entails the capacity for auto-annihilation of form. This third capacity is far more dynamic than the first two, and makes possible the rapid transformation, growth, and healing of the neurobiological world. Malabou therefore understands plasticity as a more effective and apt motor scheme than that of writing, even if it had taken Derrida's archē-writing as its point of departure. For Crockett, what is relevant is that Malabou provides a more materialist counterpart to the religious reading of Caputo -- one that demonstrates clearly an extension of Derrida's thinking into the contemporary domains of the sciences.

The eighth and final chapter, 'Quantum Derrida,' engages with Barad's 'hauntological materialism.' This chapter is probably the most difficult in the book, particularly for those of us who are novices when it comes to the recent history of theoretical physics. Nevertheless, Crockett does a good job of isolating the most relevant points in that history so as to make his argument clear. Barad's work, Meeting the Universe Halfway, takes as its object of focus, neither merely the subject, nor, as object-oriented ontology would prefer, the object, but rather, what she calls 'apparatuses,' which have to do with the overall systems in which phenomena are constructed, while recognizing that human beings are themselves dynamic constructs, and that the constructions of phenomena are not at the mercy or behest of human beings exclusively. Barad takes up the work of Niels Bohr, in particular his discovery of wave-particle complementarity, which points, according to Barad, toward an 'ontological indeterminacy' (128), an indeterminacy, or spectral irreality, at the quantum level of the real. In other essays, Barad specifically brings this ontological indeterminacy into connection with the thought of Derrida, in particular the thought of the 'trace' and the 'specter' as developed in Specters of Marx. Barad christens her materialism with the name, 'hauntological materialism.' To close out the chapter, Crockett compares Barad's notion of the 'diffraction pattern' -- 'patterns of difference that make a difference . . . the fundamental constituents that make up the world'[4] (134) -- to Derrida's notion of différance, and he provides a brief summary of Deleuze's conception of difference, arguing that Derrida's différance is very close to Deleuze's more biology-friendly notion of difference in itself. As Crockett says on the last page of the chapter, 'If we read différance as a diffraction pattern, we see how it operates outside of language, in the world, including the world of quantum physics' (138).

Crockett's afterword is a stand-alone piece. It is not connected to the argument of the rest of the book, except that it is a deeply personal, intellectual, and beautiful reflection on Crockett's indebtedness to Derrida -- a form of what Harold Bloom called, 'the anxiety of influence.' However, for Crockett, this anxiety assumes a very specific shape -- the recognition that he, Crockett, is a white man, writing on and deeply influenced by a man (Derrida), working in a field (philosophy) that has for most of its history been dominated by men. The afterword, titled 'The Sins of the Fathers -- A Love Letter,' explores the problematic question of 'authority' as it pertains to parentage, and most specifically, those figures whom we claim as our philosophical 'fathers.' He questions the extent to which philosophers, in particular male philosophers, perpetuate the lineage of philosophical patriarchy in identifying our 'fathers,' writing that 'Narcissism as love of the father is a form of identification that stabilizes and perpetuates the sexist patriarchal order' (144). Through conversations with Julia Kristeva, Colleen Hartung, Katerina Kolozova, Noëlle Vahanian, and Catherine Keller, Crockett searches for the seeds, within Derrida's thinking, to enable him to properly mourn Derrida, rather than trying to save him or redeem him. The afterword, though disconnected from the argument of the rest of the book, provides a beautiful and provocative coda.

My grumbles with Crockett's text are trifles compared with its importance. First, as someone who cut his own philosophical teeth on Derrida, I value close reading of texts. One of the strengths of Crockett's text is the extent to which it engages with a great deal of literature beyond Derrida. But at the same time, it would have been nice to have seen a deeper level of engagement with the texts of Derrida. In particular, I would have liked to have seen complex readings of significant passages from Derrida's early publication blitz of 1967. This would have better made the case that the seeds for a post-writing reading of Derrida was present all along.

Second, while I think Crockett makes an excellent case that we can read Derrida in conversation with quantum physics and ecological science, it's not clear from Crockett's text why we should; that is, it's not clear what Crockett believes Derrida's work brings to this discussion that is not brought from the philosophies of Michel Foucault, and particularly Deleuze and Félix Guattari, philosophers who did, explicitly, wrangle with the sciences, who were not reticent about the use of the word 'materialism', and so on. Crockett argues that Derrida's conception of différance is close to Deleuze's more biology-friendly concept of 'difference in itself,' but I think he could have better traced out the benefit that he sees in reading Derrida this way. And to be clear, I think his book has the tools to do it. In particular, the concepts of responsibility, and of faith, are ones that Derrida does not shy from, but that Deleuze is far less comfortable with. So I think that Crockett's work could very well provide another dimension of discussion to the discourse of the modern sciences, a stratum that Derrida brings that Deleuze might not. I would have liked to have seen it made clearer.

But, these grumbles aside, Crockett's book is an extremely important work on the future of deconstruction. Not only does it engage with much of the current scholarship on Derrida and on contemporary continental philosophy more generally, but it also makes a compelling case for a post-writing reading of Derrida, and is sure to make a lasting impact on how we read and think with Derrida.

[1] Jacques Derrida, Of Grammatology, trans. Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak (Johns Hopkins University Press, 1974), 4.

[2] Martin Heidegger, The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude, trans. William McNeill and Nicholas Walker (Indiana University Press, 2001), 176-177.

[3] John D. Caputo, The Insistence of God: A Theology of Perhaps (Indiana University Press, 2013), 133.

[4] This is a direct quotation from Barad's book. See Karen Barad, Meeting the Universe Halfway: Quantum Physics and the Entanglement of Matter and Meaning (Duke University Press, 2007), 72.