Derrida and Disinterest

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Sean Gaston, Derrida and Disinterest, Continuum, 2005, 176pp, $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826478239

Reviewed by Catherine Mills, University of South Wales


Sean Gaston's contribution to philosophical literature on the work of Jacques Derrida is to be welcomed for its serious engagement with Derrida's oeuvre and sensitive reading of his formulations of ethics and responsibility. Gaston develops an insightful and original interpretation of Derrida's work through the lens of 'disinterest' and considers the potential of this concept for contemporary ethics and politics. He highlights the eighteenth-century understanding of disinterest, in which it is seen not as the lack or absence of all interest, but as opposed to self-interest and therefore central to ethics. This understanding, Gaston contends, has been obscured through the association of disinterest with either 'private autonomy' or 'public hegemony' (vii). In returning to an ethical conception of disinterest and particularly its importance for Derrida and Levinas, Gaston elucidates Derrida's relation to Levinas, arguing that in his conception of a radical disinterest 'that founds and exceeds the interests of being', Levinas revives 'a disinterest that both redefines and reinhabits the traditional concepts of disinterest that flourished in the eighteenth century' (vii). Derrida, on the other hand, formulates a post-Nietzschean disinterest radicalized by différance, which prevents the return of the same and of identity in disinterest, effectively turning ethics toward the 'to come' (viii).

In the opening and second chapters of the book, Gaston sets out to elaborate the conceptions of disinterest that Derrida and Levinas propose. He concedes that Derrida rarely uses the term disinterest and has not attempted to redefine it in the manner of Levinas. Nevertheless, he suggests that Derrida's apparent interest in the concept can be read 'in the margins' of his main texts on Levinas, notably 'Violence and Metaphysics' and Adieu, as well as of a number of other texts such as Politics of Friendship and 'Envois'. The conception of disinterest that Gaston discerns from these meager beginnings is a decidedly post-Nietzschean one, heavily inflected by the proclamation that there is nothing more interesting or interested than the claim to disinterest. Derrida thus raises the question of an 'economy of interest' at work in disinterest, a point developed most thoroughly in his essays on Kant (3). In a later discussion of Kant, Gaston concludes that 'For Derrida, when I take an interest it is an unavoidable interest (in the impossible): an interest that takes me away from myself, from my decision or act of will to take (or not to take, to stop taking) an interest. It is a dis-interest from the other.' (67)

The 'economy of interest' in disinterest is the subject of the fifth chapter of Gaston's book, in which he argues that Kant is 'preoccupied with the question of disinterest as the attempt to mediate between the public and private', evinced in, for instance, the distinction between the public and private uses of reason in 'What is Enlightenment?'(55). From this distinction, Gaston concludes that Kant reiterates the eighteenth-century view of disinterest in its concern with the mediation between the public and private spheres, while simultaneously redistributing public and private interests. Gaston writes that 'the individual makes a private use of reason when he serves the public interests of the state [and] makes a public use of reason when he or she has the freedom to exceed the public interests of the state' (56). This means that 'to be interested is to be tied to the public interests (the interests of the state, of Frederick the Great). To be disinterested is to look toward a public that is more public than the public interest.' In effect then, Gaston argues, 'Kant internationalizes disinterest'. That is, he 'confines the traditional concept of disinterest to the state, and evokes a new kind of disinterest, a disinterest that is without national borders.' (56) Further, from a brief discussion of Kant's Groundwork, Gaston concludes that 'for Kant, there can be no ethics without interest' and 'Kantian reason has an apparently unique capacity to be interested and disinterested' (67). Gaston concludes then that, despite himself, Kant appears closer to Derrida's post-Nietzschean conception of disinterest, in which it is inseparable from interest, than to a radical separation of interest and disinterest in the manner of Levinas (67).

Of Levinas, Gaston argues that while his formulation of a radical disinterest 'that founds and exceeds the interests of being' provides a compelling alternative, he nevertheless cannot and does not wholly escape the tradition upon which he draws and to which he opposes himself. That is, 'in his attempts to break free of all the interests of the tradition, Levinas remains inextricably interested' (viii). Levinas' break with the tradition occurs in his reformulation of disinterest not as a sentiment or capacity of a 'disinterested' subject such as love or benevolence, but rather as that which dispossesses the subject of essence in substitution: 'Dis-interestedness is "the one-for-the-other to the point of substitution"' (21). Nevertheless, he invokes and reiterates a classical conception of disinterest in his belief in the possibility of a mediation between the public and private, since 'disinterest is founded on the assumption that the private can be independent of the public' (22). This point of mediation lies in the exemplary status of the secret, particularly the 'secret inner life' of the individual that 'cannot be brought to light, made visible, in the "universal order" of the state' (23). The maintenance of this secrecy allows the 'separated being' to provide a foundation for the multiplicity and pluralism that "inaugurates a society" "over and beyond the totality" (22, citing Levinas). That said, disinterest is not founded on the interiority of the subject, but rather is 'inspired by God' (28). That is, 'it is through the "idea of God" or the Infinite in me that the subject acknowledges -- and endures -- dis-interestedness.' (29)

The question of the Infinite identified here provides one of the key axes of differentiation between Levinas and Derrida for Gaston. As he argues in a brief chapter -- a mere two and half pages long -- entitled 'An Absolute Difference', which outlines the points of contrast between the two, while Levinas founds alterity and subjectivity in the 'idea of the Infinite', for Derrida these can only be founded on an 'original finitude'. That is, for Levinas the idea of the Infinite is the condition of possibility for love, whereas for Derrida, that condition is finitude. This prompts Gaston to conclude that 'perhaps the difference between Levinas and Derrida is ultimately a matter of love' (70). Strangely, rather than elaborate this conclusion, two paragraphs later he writes instead that 'perhaps the difference is a matter of prophecy' (71). Ought we to conclude from this that love and prophecy are co-extensive? What might be the implication of love and prophecy aimed at here? Unfortunately, no clarification of this is given. Rather than being an isolated incident, this lack of clarification is in fact symptomatic of one of the weaknesses of the book, in which the points made are frequently suggestive and rhetorical rather than conceptually developed arguments. This is not to say that the analysis proposed in the book is without insight; it is frequently perspicacious and original. But one is frequently left wanting more by way of conceptual clarification than is provided.

Perhaps the underlying and greatest weakness of the book, then, is the lack of structural consistency or coherence in the development of the central thesis. As the foregoing discussion indicates obliquely, there is not a strong sense of continuity in the structure of the book. While the first two chapters address Derrida’s and Levinas' relation to the traditional conception of disinterest, it is not entirely clear at this point exactly what the 'traditional' conception of disinterest is taken to be, with the result that their adherence to or divergence from that tradition is not clear either. These chapters are followed by a somewhat digressive discussion of specters and the concept of disinterest as formulated by Shaftesbury, Hobbes, and the Romantics (Wordsworth, Blake, Coleridge, and De Quincy). But given the relative lack of philosophical currency of the concept of disinterest today, the argument would have benefited from a thorough discussion of this concept before the interpretive argument in relation to Derrida and Levinas was underway. Following this outline, we turn to the question of Kant's contributions to philosophical conceptions of disinterest, a discussion that concludes with what is perhaps the strongest formulation of Derrida’s and Levinas' divergence, in that the Kantian conception of disinterest appears closer to the post-Nietzschean formulation of Derrida than to the Levinasian emphasis on the necessity of an absolute distinction between interest and disinterest. This divergence then provides the impetus for the following two chapters, the first of which is the brief chapter mentioned above, and the second of which is directed particularly toward their respective interpretations of Heidegger and the stakes of 'remettre en question' versus 'mettre en question', that is, of putting something back into question as opposed to calling it into question.

This discussion of their interpretations of Heidegger is undoubtedly interesting in itself, and gives rise to real insight into the Derrida-Levinas conversation. But it is also at this point that the central thesis of the book concerning their respective conceptions of disinterest and their relation to the tradition of that concept begins to fall away most noticeably. The three chapters which follow this offer varying interpretations of Derrida's work through three different lenses, the first of which is 'anticipation', the second 'speed' and the third of which constitutes a reflection on a difference in the capitalization of the title of a 1975 seminar on Freud, 'la vie la mort' or 'La vie la mort'. Again, these reflections are not without insight in themselves, but it is not made at all clear how they contribute to the thesis on the central concept of disinterest. Indeed, the term does not even appear in these final chapters -- which constitute almost a third of the book -- an unfortunate omission that ultimately works in opposition to the book's motivating claim, that disinterest is profoundly interesting.

In combination with the concession that Derrida's explicit engagements with the concept of disinterest are meager, the lack of structural coherence and thematic consistency means that one is left at the end of this book feeling somewhat disappointed. It is I think accurate to say that Derrida's work can be read within the frame of the concept of disinterest. In this, one might expect a detailed discussion of his conceptions of hospitality and responsibility, along with themes such as mourning, filiation, spectrality and perhaps 'mondialization'. While these themes are touched on in this book, none are given a thorough analysis and I cannot but think that more could have been done to reveal the importance of the concept of disinterest in Derrida's work than is done here.