Derrida and Legal Philosophy

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Peter Goodrich, Florian Hoffmann, Michel Rosenfeld, and Cornelia Vismann (eds.), Derrida and Legal Philosophy, Palgrave Macmillan, 2008, 257pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230573611.

Reviewed by Douglas Litowitz, Magnetar Capital LLC


This book brings together fifteen essays on Jacques Derrida's approach to justice, law, and politics. It succeeds in demonstrating that Derrida, who died from pancreatic cancer in October of 2004, was not a political nihilist. In fact, he spent much of the last two decades of his life writing about law and justice, and he was deeply concerned about persons who were disempowered and marginalized. This concern was evidenced in his theoretical writings and in his personal commitment to progressive causes. Derrida is not widely considered a major figure in the philosophy of law, but he has definitely impacted the field in two ways. First, during the 1980s, his "deconstructive" strategy for textual analysis was picked up by scholars associated with the critical legal studies movement. Second, a small but devoted group of scholars was profoundly influenced by his 1989 lecture at Cardozo Law School entitled "Force of Law," as well as subsequent books on Marxism, forgiveness, friendship, gifts, and international politics. Therefore a compendium of essays on Derrida's legal philosophy is a laudable project, and this book will be useful for those who are interested in, or already committed to, Derrida's position.

On the other hand, this book will be less useful for a general audience of legal scholars. Despite its title and its frequent admonitions to be open to others, Derrida and Legal Philosophy makes little attempt to dialogue with other legal philosophers, nor is there any treatment of specific legal controversies such as abortion, reparations, civil disobedience, or interpretive strategies. Normally this would seem a fatal flaw in a book on legal philosophy, but according to Peter Goodrich, one of the editors, Derrida's tactic is deliberate:

Derrida has nothing direct to say to lawyers. He said nothing explicit about the law that lawyers practice … . He kept deferring discussion of law, suspending the moment of judgment, asking prior questions about the nomos that comes in advance of decision … . He never got to talk about law, he never seemed to want to, he held off. What he did do, however, was take lawyers to task, directly and more often indirectly, by introducing what law has historically separated itself from: amity, community, femininity, felicity. (230-33)

Or as contributor Adam Gearey puts it, "The law that we need to think about is the substrate of any thinking about law" (201). The refusal to use legal doctrine and practice as a point of reference makes this book tough sledding. As if to make things more difficult, the editors do not provide a summary of Derrida's position, nor any bibliography of his writings on law -- there is not even any treatment of his pre-"Force of Law" essays on law such as his deconstructive reading of the American Declaration of Independence, his take on the constitution of apartheid South Africa, and his essay on Kafka's legal parable Before the Law. The fifteen essays in this volume are organized as six essays on "Theories" followed by seven essays on "Disciplines" and then two personal tributes, but the theory/practice distinction is not respected, and the overall structure does little to help the reader. Yet despite the lack of guideposts, readers can eventually piece together a rough picture of Derrida's approach to justice and law.

At bottom, Derrida's position rests upon a distinction between justice and law, which he takes to be different in kind. Derrida -- and the contributors to this book -- describe justice in vague, reverential, openly messianic terms as some kind of impossible, incalculable, unpresentable and singular obligation owed to the other, something that is never fully present but which is "to come" and which "transcends the now in the mode of perhaps" (63). According to the essay by Petra Gehring, Derrida's justice is "ultimately imponderable" (64), and according to the essay by Elisabeth Weber, justice creates an "infinite responsibility" (181) to the singularity of the other, which means that justice can never be fully achieved through the legal system. Justice, then, is undeconstructable. Law, by contrast, is a system of rules that emerges in an original creative act of violence in which sovereignty is asserted and maintained by force. Because law arises in an act of construction, it can be deconstructed by tracing it back to foundational documents that create a legal apparatus in an autobiographical fiction; for example, the founding of the United States might be seen as a proclamation and seizure of sovereignty by a group of men who created the fiction of "We the People."

And yet while justice and law are different in kind, they are epistemically linked because justice makes itself felt as a horizon (in the sense of a backdrop or a limit) that is imminent within the law. That is, legal reasoning will inevitably run aground on a series of insoluble aporias that will point back to justice. These aporias, according to contributor Petra Gehring, are as follows: (i) each case must be subsumed under a general rule yet also taken on its own merits, rendering the law a contradictory stew of general and specific; (ii) each case is haunted by the ghost of the undecidable since justice requires a decision for the specific individual at bar but laws are by nature general; and (iii) each decision has a time limit even though ultimately each person is owed infinite time. The process of deconstructing the law (that is, questioning the authority of each law and tracing the chain back to an act of founding violence) points toward justice, which Derrida describes as the experience of "absolute alterity" and "the chance of the event and condition of history" (195). Thus Derrida concludes that "Deconstruction is justice" (63). This position is then wedded to a messianic notion of "democracy to come" and the embrace of a certain "spirit of Marxism," coupled with invocations for a New International where people will engage in a radical critique of international law.

By this series of moves -- which, I might add, goes almost entirely unchallenged in this volume -- Derrida eventually sets up (one is tempted to say "constructs") a rather detailed theory of justice and law, which he then couples with reflections on friendship, hospitality, and gift-giving. He extends this unwieldy theoretical apparatus across the board to terrorism, communism, international law, and beyond. This is a complicated set of moves which is not made any clearer by the air of paradox affected in many of the essays. For example, in an essay on terrorism Michel Rosenfeld reads Derrida as holding that "true friendship is impossible friendship," "laws can never be just," and "justice is necessary and impossible" (73-76). In Peter Krapp's essay on amnesty and forgiveness we learn that, "Derrida insists that a pardon either forgives the unpardonable or it is not truly a pardon" (170). And so forth. As in Derrida's own work, the contributions rely heavily on etymology and word play, that is, the attempt to derive the current 'synchronic' meaning of a word from its historical 'diachronic' origin, or from related and similar sounding words. Those who are familiar with this approach will feel at home, while others may be put off by the lack of arguments in the traditional sense. To be sure, a number of interesting themes are treated in the book (terrorism, the role of archives, amnesty, rogue states, the relationship between law and poetry, etc.), and Derrida was certainly doing something unique by approaching legal and political questions from the vantage points of friendship, hospitality, ghosts, mourning, and so forth. For this, he and the contributors to this volume should be praised; they are sparking a wave of interdisciplinary scholarship that is far richer than traditional law review fare. But it soon becomes apparent that Derrida's framework is too slender a reed to support a research agenda spanning so many different disciplines.

The central problem is that Derrida's account of justice rests on assumptions that contradict the letter and spirit of his early deconstructive writings. Surely there is a paradox of Derrida dismantling Western philosophy as a logocentric metaphysics of presence and then his turning around and praising the "classical emancipatory idea" which is rooted in precisely these concepts. It is curious that Derrida did not simply hold that justice is relative to social meanings, and that these meanings are relatively fluid and contestable (a la Michael Walzer, for example); it is puzzling that he found the need to posit an undeconstructible justice. At one point, Adam Thurschwell, in what is perhaps the clearest and most ambivalent essay, rightly asks, "Can one justify an experience such as the experience of the undecidable that Derrida says conditions every genuine decision, or only attest to it?" (157). Thurschwell concludes, rightly I think, that Derrida's position is beyond theoretical or empirical justification according to the standards of traditional scholarship, because it is tantamount to describing an ur-experience that precedes political engagement, which means (I suppose) that one either feels it or doesn't. According to Simon Critchley, the experience of justice is "an a priori structure that is not reducible to ground or foundation" (29), but it's not clear whether Critchley means this as a transcendental argument, as a phenomenological account, or as a reading of the meaning of justice in the West, for example. At the end of the day, there is nothing in Derrida to explain why a person should choose justice over injustice, nor whether justice evolves, nor who can decide what is just, nor how a just decision can be made. Derrida wants to postpone or bracket these questions, but in so doing he has bracketed the very field where discussions about justice and law take place.

The editors pursue the trope that Derrida acts as a kind of enigma, specter, or ghost who haunts legal theory. They note that the term "deconstruction" often appears in top-ranked law review articles without any reference to Derrida, which ostensibly proves that Derrida's ideas filter into legal theory anonymously as a "talisman, either of heresy, or of enigma and truth" (7). Now, putting aside the irony of looking at leading law reviews to assess the impact of a scholar who emphasized margins and excluded terms, the editors then tell us that the message of Derrida's writings on law is that "we should be open to enigmas" and to "the enigmatic quality of legal texts" -- and we are told that an enigma is a "specter, a figure of an absent and invisible, or more simply, distant cause" (1, 14). As with many sweeping pronouncements and moralistic admonitions coming from the Derrida camp, it is not clear at whom this is directed. Is there a group of legal scholars who offend this injunction, and how is Derrida more respectful of enigmas? This tactic of shifting the discussion onto ambiguous claims can be found in the first essay in this volume, where Simon Critchley asserts that,

Derrida is particularly anxious to distinguish the idea of 'democracy to come' from any idea of a future democracy, where the future would be a modality of presence, namely the not-yet-present … . It is a question of linking the 'democracy to come' to the messianic experience of the here and now, without which justice would be meaningless. So, the thought here is the experience of justice as the maintaining-now of the relation to an absolute singularity is the 'to come' of democracy. (30)

Now, like most charitable readers of Continental philosophy, I am willing to approach this kind of statement by putting aside the crucibles of verifiability and falsification, and instead asking in hermeneutic fashion whether the passage makes sense as a plausible interpretation of my experience in the law (which is extensive, by the way). But even by such loose standards, there is not much to extract from this type of writing -- one either feels the messianic pull of the unpresentable justice and the democracy that is "to come" or one doesn't; the latter is my fate, apparently, and there is nothing here that compels a reassessment or re-reading of my experience.

Finally, the editors included several essays containing extensive personal information about Derrida, but they have weeded out the most interesting events where Derrida bumped against the reality of law. In a heartfelt essay, Avital Ronell describes how she went from co-teaching an annual seminar with Derrida to living at his house in Paris, meditating with him, ministering to him, embracing him, and so forth. Mention is made of the controversy surrounding Derrida's receipt of an honorary degree from Cambridge University. More interestingly, there is speculation about the impact of Derrida's background as an Algerian Jew who was expelled from school by anti-Semitic decree. But there is no mention of L'Affaire Derrida which unfolded in the pages of the New York Review of Books in the early 1990s, in which Derrida asserted legal ownership over an interview that he gave to Le Nouvel Observateur and which was licensed to professor Richard Wolin for inclusion in a book that was critical of Derrida; apparently Derrida asserted ownership of the text (a dubious legal claim), then brought his lawyers into the mix and leaned on Columbia University Press to redact subsequent editions of Wolin's book. More recently, while in the throes of a terminal illness, Derrida's threatened to renege on a written promise to donate his archives to the University of California at Irvine because that University was investigating a professor friend of Derrida's (a vampire scholar, no less) for sexual harassment of a female graduate student. Finally, there was an episode where Derrida was arrested on trumped-up drug charges in Prague after meeting with dissidents, and was freed with the help of the French government and, apparently, Michel Foucault. I do not bring up these examples to embarrass Derrida (who by most accounts was a modest and generous person), but rather to show that the editors could have explored events in his life that would have provided a much richer backdrop for understanding his view of justice than the rather hagiographic portraits found in this book.

As the editors correctly point out, Derrida is routinely denounced by scholars unfamiliar with his work. This means that certain people will reject this book simply because it is associated with Derrida. Conversely, certain people embrace everything that Derrida writes, and they will have the opposite, equally uncritical, reaction to this book. In between these extremes is a group of scholars, like myself, who are moderately sympathetic to Derrida. Most of us are generally willing to endure Derrida's lack of argumentative rigor, his endless word games and pretentious deferrals, in exchange for those few shining moments when he offers a truly unique reading of a key text, or when he draws attention to a person or a concept that has been wrongfully excluded or marginalized. Such readers would probably be receptive to a book about Derrida and legal philosophy if it clearly set forth Derrida's notion of justice and demonstrated how it complements, challenges, or improves upon the positions staked out by other legal philosophers. It is curious that instead of reaching out in this way, the contributors to this book seem content to decry Derrida's marginalized status as a legal philosopher without demonstrating why it is so undeserved.