Derrida and the Inheritance of Democracy

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Samir Haddad, Derrida and the Inheritance of Democracy, Indiana University Press, 2013, 178pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253008411.

Reviewed by Matthias Fritsch, Concordia University


As we may surmise from the many books and articles that have been published since his death in 2004, interest in Derrida's work appears unabated, at least in the English-speaking world. In addition, many seminars are still to be published, and quite a few texts have not yet been translated into English. However, the exact meaning of his arguments and interventions, while perhaps becoming clearer, have yet to be determined, and in fact in ways that seem to go beyond the usual situation of new interpretations of an author being presented. Perhaps this is not surprising, for Derrida has insisted on this indetermination as in fact a condition for taking up any legacy: a text that did not permit new, to some extent unpredictable readings could in fact not be read at all. This puts interpreters of Derrida in a curious double bind: they ought to respect its ultimate unreadability while nonetheless seeking to make it clearer, to advance scholarship. One way of handling the double bind is to make of this tension between reading and unreadability, between inheriting and futural openness, an explicit theme. This is the path chosen by Samir Haddad in the book under review here, and he travels it well.

In a well-researched, knowledgeable, and nuanced book, Haddad's overall argument is that Derrida's 'democracy to-come', as well as his moral and political philosophy in general, should not be seen primarily as turned toward the future, despite the 'to come' in the title. Against what he perceives as the "utopianism" in Derrida scholarship, the "dominant tendency" to privilege the future, democracy to-come should be seen as involving the "injunction to inherit from the past in a very particular way" (3). The particularity at issue is to rethink the very contrast between past and future in which the major thesis of the book is framed. That this contrast is to be avoided is unsurprising, given that already Husserl and Heidegger, two of Derrida's most important sources, argued against presupposing the kind of linear time that permits the opposition between past and future in the first place (on linear time, see 37-40). Hence, the claim that the to-come is linked to inheritance needs more fine-tuning, and Haddad provides it in the six chapters that make up this comparatively short book (142 pages of small print, plus notes).

The first chapter presents the "structure of aporia" that so often appears to be the overall conclusion of a Derridian reading, in particular his treatment of normative concepts (democracy, justice, gift-giving, and so on). Haddad carefully explains the aporia to consist in a contradictory but mutually dependent relation between an unconditional and a conditional law (hospitality being his primary example here), and argues convincingly against the misreading that pure or unconditional hospitality is a moral ideal in all contexts (21). The chapter concludes that despite its "formal" structure, the terms of aporia are inherited (22), so that chapter two needs to examine the relation between aporia and legacy. It argues that the "structure" of inheritance is equally aporetic: an inheritance calls for but defies assumption and interpretation. It demands an involuntary affirmation -- anything we say about a tradition is only ever a response to its precedence -- while also demanding filtering and choosing (24-6). Thus, inheritance consists in an oscillation between passivity and activity, necessity and choice. Further, the chapter shows that, for Derrida, to inherit a text deconstructively means to "raise its stakes" (surenchère) by revealing aporia at work in it -- though this, Haddad argues, is in the realm of freedom and choice rather than "the sphere of necessity" (34), so something Derrida recommends should be done (35-37).

The third chapter then connects aporetic inheriting to democracy. Democracy is an inherited concept, but one that turns the present to the future, as democracy is inherently promissory. Democracy promises freedom and equality, for instance (63), but also the very fact that there is a future to-come, a future of change and transformation that renders democracy inherently unstable, resulting in a mutability that Plato disdained and, on Derrida's telling, Rousseau admired (53). Beyond this examination of some of the connotations of democracy in the Western tradition, the chapter culminates in the "stronger claim" (66) that what is specific about democracy as a political form -- though for Derrida it is always more than one regime among others -- is its express calling for inheritance, its explicit opening onto histories still in the making. For in permitting its own critique and deconstruction, democracy affirms the perfectibility of its inherited meanings from an open future. For Haddad, this democratic inheriting is characterized by a normative "space for choice" (67) within which Derrida privileges some elements of the democratic heritage above others, especially those elements -- such as free speech, openness to criticism, hospitality to singularity -- that permit the aporetic raising of the stakes with which chapter two identified deconstruction (68). Inherit we must, but to inherit deconstructively is a choice.

On Haddad's reading, then, to engage in deconstruction -- as understood here, to not merely describe but to "actively amplify" aporias (no doubt a tenuous distinction), thereby opening an inheritance to greater and further transformability, which first of all renders deconstructive inheriting democratic (79) -- is a normative choice, and so it calls for justification (73). Hence chapter four turns to the question of whether, and if so how, deconstruction can recommend itself and justify normative choices. The discussion of deconstructive normativity in this, the longest chapter, is very nuanced and engages secondary sources more than the other chapters; one may see it as the heart of the book. Haddad stakes out his own view by situating it vis-à-vis two other, contrasting but Derrida-friendly views on this issue. The first, represented by Martin Hägglund, argues that on account of its insistence on undecidability, deconstruction cannot give normative reasons (taken to be norms, rules, or principles) for choosing one course of action over another (77). The second view, associated with Richard Beardsworth and my own hypothetical formulation (157n14), is discussed here in Leonard Lawlor's version.

Lawlor claims that deconstruction can normatively justify choices by drawing, not on a positive but on the negative ideal of the 'worst violence', which counsels promoting the "lesser violence", a notion Derrida had famously used in his 1964 essay on Levinas (80, 90) -- but, Haddad argues, not since then. The 'worst' describes a state of affairs in which differences in general, which on a deconstructive account alone permit life to live and inheritance to open onto the to-come, are obliterated. Given the constitutive nature of the differential relation to alterity and to death, this state of utter homogeneity, Haddad argues convincingly, is not a real possibility, not a possibility a subject can aim at (88), and that is why he suggests it cannot supply a measure for free, and thus normatively bound action. He further shows that, given its impossibility, one can always argue that there are worse things than 'the worst' (87). Conversely but for the same reason, the worst often boils down, not to the eradication of life-in-death in general, but to somewhat less grand substitutes, such as the life of this or that archive, culture, or heritage. Even their destruction without remainder may be impossible, for Haddad suggests that the eradication of humanity in its entirety would leave traces (87).

Against the idea of the lesser violence, Haddad further argues -- less convincingly I think, though without the space to argue that here -- that the threat of the worst is "inherent in all positions", so that opposing it does not distinguish one position from another (83, 88). This is what we could learn from Hägglund, who is taken to show that Derridean undecidability implies the inseparability of the threat of death from the chance of survival (75, 92). Thus, the lesser violence cannot be separated from the threat of the worst (81). One may have hoped at this point that Haddad's own useful distinctions among individual deaths, the less grand substitutes, and the worst itself (84) would have been tested for their ability to render the 'lesser violence' more convincing. Be that as it may, Haddad further argues that Derrida's stress on the unpredictability of the constitutive future to come disallows predictions as to which course of action results in the lesser violence (92).

Beyond Lawlor, then, and in particular against Hägglund, with whom Haddad here continues a critical exchange of views, the chapter concludes that any normativity in Derrida is the result of the values associated with the terms he picks out from 'his' legacies: "the language with which he must necessarily engage is already infused with value in a sedimented history" (96). Anyone who argues that historical embeddedness in inherited languages, traditions, and lifeworlds is co-constitutive of subjects -- though it should be noted that Derrida does this not in a historicist vein but along the lines of a quasi-transcendental argument that comes with its own performativity or even normativity -- will have to take note of the fact that such histories carry many intricately connected 'values' and evaluative languages that it may not be easy to bring to awareness and critique. Haddad now argues that this fact alone permits Derrida to justify his choices, for he, like anyone else, can rely on those inherited values that have achieved a higher "degree of inherited stability" (96). Although he appears to insist that this level of normativity -- the one he characterized in terms of choice, freedom, and justification -- stems only from inherited languages, he acknowledges that this level is inseparable from the unconditional openness to the future to-come that carries, as he argued, its own injunction. The reader might thus have expected a clarification of the relation between the two, such as a further elaboration of the earlier claim that conditional hospitality responds to unconditional openness. Further, as far as I can see, Haddad does not return explicitly to the question how 'relatively stable', inherited values could justify engaging in deconstruction, as he has presented it.

The following chapter then makes of Derrida's discussion of friendship a test case of the democratic, normative inheriting theorized in the preceding chapters. In inheriting the notions of 'friendship' and 'fraternity' in the Western democratic tradition -- and Politics of Friendship, Haddad suggests, is Derrida's most genealogical book (102) -- Derrida raises their stakes, intensifies tensions, and thus renders the terms more transformable and 'political belonging' more inclusive (107). The aporia in this case, traced throughout some canonical texts, consists in the conjunction of the demand for friends to be both similar and dissimilar, equal and unequal, symmetrical and asymmetrical, sharing everything and yet still retaining enough distance to give to each other. The contradiction between these two demands, one more Greco-Roman and the other more Christian, is often smoothed over by the figure of the equal-yet-different brother, at the expense of the exclusion of women -- women who are, the chapter suggests, also too absent from Derrida's own work (116). Deconstructively inheriting this tradition by amplifying its aporias thus above all consists in proposing democracy to-come as beyond fraternity -- a move beyond, however, that cannot be a clean and totalizing break (108), for, so the claim goes, Derrida must stay within the heritage, mobilizing some aspects against others (113).

Questioning the value of fraternity also means questioning the foundation of the political on the alleged naturality, singularity, and necessity of the birth that ties brothers to each other. For this reason, Haddad's concluding chapter analyzes the theme of birth, no doubt a fitting theme in a book that argues inheritance occurs from out of an open-ended future. Haddad thinks birth shows great internal instability in Derrida's work, on account of which it recommends itself as a focal point for inheriting Derrida's work for the future by intensifying its tensions in turn (118). The instability in the theme of birth lies in its multiple meanings, for Derrida is said to treat birth as negative, positive, ambivalent, and aporetic. Derrida often positively associates the arrival of a child with an openness to the future and with the arrival of the stranger to which the political must be hospitable (121), but given his discussion of fraternal politics as grounded on natural birth, when the latter is associated more with the past, his view of birth is ambivalent and unstable (123, 129). This ambivalence can be raised to an aporia by showing that birth's singularity is iterable and the irreplaceable mother substitutable, nonetheless. This aporetic understanding opens birth to inheritance, and that means to "alternations in its meaning and its value" (135).

The fine readings of Derrida in this book conclude with the insight that an heir, including a deconstructive one, can only "destabilize certain notions by stabilizing others" (141). If that is true, Derrida's heirs may continue this genealogical practice by discovering instabilities in the stabilities, as Haddad did in the case of birth, but expand them to even include the notion of aporia itself, the very one that defined deconstructive inheritance.

If I may be permitted a critical remark, it would concern Haddad's treatment of normativity, which I take to be one of the two central concerns of the book (the other being inheritance). As indicated, Haddad's overall concern is to interrogate what is normative and what is not in Derrida, and how well-founded his own normative predilections are, especially the signature choice of deconstruction: to inherit by uncovering tensions and bringing them to a head in aporias. Haddad is aware of the debates in the literature as to whether deconstruction should be seen as 'normative' or not, and so promises a welcome advance in Derrida scholarship. His treatment of this theme is multifaceted, and I cannot do it justice in a review. However, one key move of his, as we have seen, is to distinguish between a factual "sphere of necessity" (34) and a realm of freedom and choice. The former is that about which we can do nothing (28), and which could not be otherwise (33); by contrast, the 'sphere of the normative' is for Haddad coextensive with the sphere of choice or of 'freedom'. It is this latter sphere that calls for justifications, typically supplied by norms or, as we heard, by the relative stability of elements of a tradition.

I wonder whether this distinction between necessary facts and values that leave some choice, however natural it may appear, is of much help. I worry that it may stem from an objectivist metaphysics that at least Heiddegerean phenomenology and deconstruction have endeavoured to overcome. Haddad accepts, rightly in my view, that for Derrida inheritance, unconditional hospitality, justice, openness to the future as radically other, and so on are both quasi-transcendental and performative concepts. Without historicity and without futural openness, no identity could be established, and so no agency, moral or otherwise. But this quasi-transcendental insight has a 'performative' or even 'normative' significance, for inheritance is never a given, but a "task" promised to the future, and no subject could come about without relation to an alterity that demands hospitality and responsibility (14) or, in the terms of the later chapter, a promise of friendship that for Derrida is also a promise of non-violence, even if pure non-violence could for him never obtain.[1] That is why Haddad is right, in my view, to argue that in Derrida's work the "constative, descriptive analysis" cannot be separated from performativity (or, if you wish, normativity) (98), and indeed, in two forms or at two levels: not from the "performative force" of inherited concepts like democracy, but also not from the quasi-transcendental unconditional that calls for and upsets inherited conditions, laws, and regimes (96-7).

But with such a starting point, with quasi-transcendental-cum-performative historicity, have we not left behind the eminently modern idea of an objective world of facts onto which (human) subjects may or may not project values, values that could be otherwise? And yet, it seems, Haddad's distinction between facts and freedom draws on this modern objectivism that, albeit on different grounds, much of both continental and analytic philosophy of the second half of the 20th century have tried to overcome by arguing against a strong fact-value distinction. Haddad approaches Derridian inheritance with the question of what in it is fact and what is free choice; given that he notices that the quasi-transcendental infrastructures (iterability, différance, spectrality, and so on) come with inseparable demands, promises, and injunctions, he distinguishes these as a special type of 'il faut' that can be assimilated to "statements of facts" (28).

It is reasonable to ask, as Sartre did preeminently, what an heir could change, and what not. However, where normativity originates and how far it extends may be better treated as a different issue, for normativity cannot be defined restrictively by reference to freedom and choice. To be sure, the heir has always already responded to and affirmed, involuntarily, her inheritance, her birth, and therewith her belonging with others in a non-objectifiable, productive, intergenerational quasi-community of birth and death. And indeed she cannot help but re-affirm this non-chosen, constitutive emergence in and through legacies, languages, and political belongings. Before you criticize a tradition, you must first have inherited and interpreted it; quasi-transcendental historicity permits no metadiscourse. But it's precisely because inheritance and community are thus affirmed, performed, projected and promised, both to a horizon of anticipation and to a to-come beyond horizons, that they are never mere facts we must accept passively. Rather, they are moving assemblages open to, indeed calling for, the transformations that alone let them live on. That is why, I'd suggest, there are no two different types of 'il faut' in the claim that inheritance calls on the heir to "reaffirm in choosing" (24, 28-37); the choosing responds to the affirmation. It seems to me that Haddad's conclusion to the chapter on normativity agrees with this. There he argues that the constative, the performative, and the unconditional stand in a relation of "mutual interdependence" (98). Given that the performative-normative force is not just inherited (for example, by picking up the term democracy), for the unconditional comes with the very injunction to inherit (again, as the overall claim of the book has it, the open future is inseparable from the past), Haddad is right to insist, on his view against Hägglund, that the unconditional cannot be analyzed in isolation from values, commitments, and normative force (97-9).

There are better and worse ways of choosing, of course, but anyone who goes searching in Derrida for freely chosen criteria for this will be disappointed. If 'normative' is taken to circumscribe, restrictively, the field of choice, then deconstruction is much more interested in the quasi-ontological accounting for this 'field' and for the allegedly free subjectivity that reigns in it. As indicated, such questioning finds itself preceded and outstripped by an involuntary affirmation of inheritance and a promise of friendship to others, near and far. This normative-performative affirmation of the unconditional in and through inherited conditions, or an affirmation of conditions exposed to their opening and living-on, also puts into question the principle 'ought implies can' on which the delimitation of the field of subjective choice tacitly relies. That the affirmation is itself both unconditional and conditional means also that subjectivity is aporetic or auto-immune in its very being, and so aporetic inheriting cannot itself be a mere choice.

I think this is what we may learn from Haddad's highly valuable, probing, and critical discussion of normativity in relation to democratic inheritance. For those interested in deconstructive ethics and politics, this is an indispensable book.

[1] Jacques Derrida, "Remarks on Deconstruction and Pragmatism" in Chantal Mouffe (ed.), Deconstruction and Pragmatism (London: Routledge, 1996), p. 83.