Derrida and Theology

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Steven Shakespeare, Derrida and Theology, Continuum, 2009, 233pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780567032409.

Reviewed by Sarah Hammerschlag, Williams College



What is most impressive about Steven Shakespeare’s Derrida and Theology is its clarity and accuracy. Considering that the subject matter concerns Jacques Derrida’s relevance to the field of theology, this is saying something indeed. It is a given that Derrida’s arguments are notoriously difficult to parse and even more difficult to translate into prose untainted by jargon. But these issues become further complicated when the factors of religion or theology are introduced. For the past three decades critics have been debating over the potential theological significance of Derrida’s conceptual battery. Depending on whom one reads, différance is either a principle of sheer nihilism or another name for the unknowable God of Eckhartian mysticism. Steven Shakespeare has the wisdom to resist both alternatives. Rather, he provides a sensible and balanced tour of the major Derrida works, focusing in particular on those that deal in themes directly referencing both the Christian and Jewish religious traditions, such as circumcision, messianicity, and the gift. All this makes Shakespeare’s book eminently useful.

Derrida and Theology seems intended for an audience versed in theology but acquainted with Derrida only through hearsay, or by way of one of his interpreters. One of Shakespeare’s primary purposes in the book is to correct the misrepresentations of Derrida in heavy circulation and to replace them with a guide for the theologically invested reader, one that will send her back to the texts to explore for herself. The strengths of this approach are quite clear, but it does have one considerable drawback: it leaves Shakespeare without any definitive point to make on the relation between Derrida and theology.

Anyone searching for the book’s argument will be hard pressed to find a decisive statement on the matter. The closest Shakespeare comes are statements such as the following:

I am not claiming that Derrida is endorsing an alternative theological approach, even one as strangely heterodox as the one suggested here. However, his work does open possibilities for the theological imagination that are not shut down by his suspicion of the God of pure presence. (77)

One would assume that this claim would be followed by a clear delineation of said possibilities, and perhaps finally by some meditation on the most fruitful among them. Rather, Shakespeare continually defers on the specifics, allowing the answer to remain open-ended. We could of course read this as a sign of his respect for Derrida’s own conceptualization of messianicity which insists that a true messianic awaiting resists predetermining the horizon for what can and may appear. Let us suppose, however, that this was indeed Shakespeare’s intention. Certainly it would be an approach (perhaps the only one) that showed respect for Derrida’s method. However, it would also sabotage the very claim being made. After all, such a position takes us no further than Derrida’s own, and seems to suggest even that constructive theology built on a Derridian framework would have to fail before it had even begun, for the very act of fulfilling possibilities, utilizing the theological imagination, would betray the openness that the notion of messianicity demands. Should we read Shakespeare’s book then as enacting the deconstruction of its own claims? Perhaps, but Shakespeare seems far too earnest about the theological potential of Derridian concepts for me to fully accept this reading. Rather, he seems very earnestly to be establishing the conditions under which Derrida could be seen as a resource for the theological imagination. While Shakespeare does make a distinction between the early Derrida and the late Derrida, he sees a unified set of concerns in Derrida’s writings, none of which would be irrelevant to theology.

The first two chapters provide one of the clearest basic introductions to Derrida’s philosophy. Shakespeare not only sets about outlining the basic structures in Derrida’s philosophy (the logic of the trace, its relation both to the history of metaphysics and to textual interpretation and its origins in Derrida’s reading of Husserlian phenomenology), he also situates Derrida’s concerns in relation to the major issues within modern continental philosophy, reviewing the history of transcendental idealism from Kant forward and its relation to Hegel, Husserl and Heidegger. He assumes little background on the part of the reader and yet he is able to quickly and efficiently summarize major dilemmas in the history of philosophy without becoming bogged down in their details.

Most importantly he focuses in on the question of origin as the onto-theological problem plaguing metaphysics and theology. Shakespeare, like a number of other postmodern theologians and philosophers, sees Derrida as a resource for rethinking theology outside of the parameters of the onto-theological tradition, as a means to dispense with the concepts of creation ex-nihilo and the causa sui. In one of the book’s most decisive moments he suggests that the right reading of Derrida might allow us to retrieve an account of creation that takes seriously the pre-originary chaos of tohu v’bohu. What Shakespeare does not seem willing to do, however, is to follow other theologians in making claims about Derrida’s actual theological proximity to either the Christian or Jewish tradition. Thus Shakespeare maintains a critical distance from thinkers such as Kevin Hart and Jean-Luc Marion who contend that the Christian tradition already provides us a path away from a metaphysics of presence, one that Derrida merely replicates.

Shakespeare proceeds in the third, fourth and fifth chapter to consider in turn three sites in Derrida’s corpus where he makes use of, draws close to, or abstracts from the Jewish and Christian theological tradition. The first of these I find the most problematic. Chapter three is entitled “The Other, the Thief, the Great Furtive One: Saving the Names of God,” and it is here that two of the weaknesses of Shakespeare’s project appear. In this chapter he considers the places in which Derrida mentions the term ‘God’ as well as those moments where concepts of Derrida’s own serve a function that might seem to take the place of God. In the first case, Shakespeare falls into a trap that he himself avowedly knows to avoid. He fails to make distinctions between Derrida’s own position and the way in which he mobilizes the terminology of the author whom he is reading. Thus when treating the essay “Edmond Jabès and the question of the book” he calls on Derrida’s own summary and repetition of Jabès’ references to a kabbalistic God to illustrate how Derrida might serve as a resource for thinking of God as self-differing. Derrida himself seems to invite this mistake, and at the same time calls attention to it, by ending the essay with a citation from Jabès, which makes it appear that Derrida has signed the essay “Reb Rida” when the name is in fact part of a quotation from Jabès’s Book of Questions.

Certainly the signature is a sign that Derrida must have recognized that he was engaging in the same mode of interpretation as Jabès’ imaginary rabbis, but the fact that he only takes on this role by way of citation is an indication that he does not inhabit this language as his own, but rather as one he is ventriloquizing. Shakespeare gives in to the temptation to read Derrida’s engagement with the language of kabbalah as a sign that Derrida is himself something of a kabbalist. To my mind this is a moment of wishful interpretation.

In the second case Shakespeare attempts to think through what it would mean for theology to consider a portrait of God drawn from Derrida’s notion of différance. The claim is not that différance is another name for God, but rather that Derrida’s characterization of différance might open the way for a re-conceptualization of God in non-originary terms, as the trace of otherness (75). This raises the question: how elastic is the term “theology”? Given that Derrida’s description of différance, even when put in generative terms, does away with so many of the features understood as definitive for the monotheistic God of Judaism, Christianity and Islam — features such as sovereignty and priority — I wonder if such an association would not necessarily stretch the tradition past its breaking point.

To my mind Shakespeare fares better with the later Derrida, particularly at the sites where Derrida is explicitly in dialogue with the Abrahamic traditions. It is indeed not difficult to see how Christian thinkers might engage Derrida’s concepts of the gift and messianicity, finding here “a moving network of provocations” which “teases, lures, offends” and demands of theology “an element of deadly and earnest jesting that hollows out such discourses” (211). The pertinent question is whether anything that one can properly call theology can survive a rigorous Derridian testing. Shakespeare is ultimately not afraid to ask this question even as he insists that Derrida’s thinking opens up new possibilities for theology. At the same time he rightly rejects Martin Hägglund’s claim that the trace with its logic of spacing exposes all things to the corrosion of difference, thus ruling out any concept of God and making Derrida a “radical atheist.”1

Ultimately Shakespeare is faithful to what Derrida teaches us about the mechanics of the ontological tradition. At the very least, Shakespeare contends, Derrida provides a fool proof response to radical atheism of any stripe by exposing the fact that God can never fully be expelled from the scene for the very reason that he haunts any attempt to articulate otherness, generation and futurity. Shakespeare’s greatest contribution in Derrida and Theology is not that he is able to articulate a way forward for theology’s engagement with the philosopher of deconstruction, but rather that he exposes the way in which the debates over Derrida’s theological standing ultimately affirm one of Derrida’s foundational points: that the metaphysical game is ultimately one that plays us.

1 Hägglund, Martin, Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life (Stanford: Stanford UP, 2008).