Derrida on Deconstruction

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Barry Stocker, Derrida on Deconstruction, Routledge, 2006, 304pp., $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415325021.

Reviewed by Simon Lumsden, University of New South Wales


The extraordinary complexity of Derrida's thought, his style and the nature of his philosophical project makes writing an introductory guidebook to his thought exceptionally challenging. The Routledge Philosophy Guidebooks series sets itself the task of providing clearly written introductory works that try to minimise the use of technical language, making them as accessible as possible to an advanced undergraduate audience. Authors (and the editors no doubt) also want those works to be able to stand in their respective fields as works that make a genuine contribution to scholarship. This is a very difficult balancing act. Some of the works in this series, notably Sebastian Gardner's Kant and the Critique of Pure Reason and Genevieve Lloyd's Spinoza and the Ethics offer distinctive readings of these philosophers that are models of clarity, readability and rigorous scholarship while also being genuinely introductory works. Stocker's introduction to Derrida focuses much less than these works on being a substantive contribution to Derrida scholarship and largely aims to be an introductory work. Given the extraordinarily diverse, prolific and difficult nature of Derrida's texts, any work that clearly and straightforwardly introduces his ideas, his criticisms of the philosophical tradition and some of the key influences on his thought would be a substantial achievement. There are few works in English on Derrida that achieve this. Derrida on Deconstruction is a welcome attempt to present Derrida's thought clearly and systematically.

Stocker focuses on Derrida's early writings and there are good reasons for doing for this: the great number of his works, that his early works are his most well known, that they clearly structure the development of all his later writings and also to make this a manageable project for the author. Stocker largely restricts himself to works published in France prior to 1975 and he gives a comprehensive and systematic appraisal of most of these important works. (The only chapter where I think there is, in the context of this project, a strong case for looking at the later works is in the discussion of ethics and politics. Derrida's later writings were much more explicitly concerned with these themes and they bring out the issues more clearly than his early writings.) Derrida on Deconstruction is organised into various chapters on canonical themes in philosophy: metaphysics, language, consciousness, values and aesthetics. Stocker's approach to introducing Derrida and Deconstruction takes place on two parallel levels. Firstly, he tries to situate Derrida in relation to the major philosophical thinkers and movements that shaped his thought: Plato, Rousseau, Saussure, Husserl, Heidegger, Hegel, Structuralism, Foucault, Freud and Levinas. Secondly, and this is the real innovation of the book, is the comprehensive engagement of Derrida with the analytic tradition. The extensive engagement with Analytic philosophy is both the strength and the weakness of this book.

Placing Derrida in relation to the central debates and figures in analytic philosophy is a useful tool in making a claim for Derrida as one of the great figures of 20th century philosophy and not just Continental philosophy. I have considerable reservations, however, about the way in which Stocker goes about trying to introduce Derrida by situating him in relation to various figures and problems in the analytic tradition. There have been few serious sustained engagements of Derrida with key figures and themes in Analytic philosophy. On the face of it there is every reason for this discussion to take place -- there are prima facie numerous affinities and productive differences with Quine, Davidson, Sellars, McDowell, Cavell, Putnam and so on. In Derrida and Deconstruction, however, its ability to serve as a useful and informative introduction to Derrida's thought is hindered by the way the work situates Derrida's thought in relation to both the Analytic and the Continental tradition. The book is written as though the author is trying to convince analytic philosophers that Derrida has a position that can be plotted in relation to most of the major themes and figures in Analytic philosophy. There is nothing in principle wrong with this approach but in the case of this work the large number of figures and problems examined has resulted in a work in which there is not, for the most part, a clearly and systematically developed account of the various problems in Analytic philosophy; moreover Derrida's position on these problems is not dealt with in any revealing detail. Derrida for example is said to have things to say about private language arguments, has a (tacit) position on supervenience, naturalism and so on.

Stocker gives brief and not particularly incisive accounts of these various problems in Analytic philosophy and then attempts to slot Derrida's thought in relation to these views. There is much to be gleaned from a detailed confrontation between, for example, Sellars and Derrida -- how they approach metaphysics, science, the given and empiricism. Such an engagement could be done in a way that animates their core philosophical claims and differences. In Stocker's case, for example in his first chapter 'Metaphysics', he tries to place Derrida on a spectrum with such a large cast of figures (Aristotle, Descartes, Rousseau, Quine, Strawson, Peirce, Evans, Russell, Wittgenstein, Husserl, Kripke, Saussure, Chomsky and more) all within 20 odd pages. Because he focuses on so many authors there is no clear idea of what the standard view of metaphysics is and it is difficult to discern Derrida's criticisms of it. The chapter is so cluttered with positions and personalities that the lead actor does not really stand out from the extras. The subsequent three chapters are similarly burdened with brief summaries of numerous analytic and continental thinkers with their respective accounts of language, consciousness and knowledge.

There are numerous problems with trying to introduce Derrida's thought by situating it in relation to so many movements, thinkers and philosophical problems. What in particular is lost is the distinctiveness and radicalness of Derrida's position. If we are to understand the innovation of his thought we need to see how and why Derrida criticises, challenges and transforms traditional philosophical problems (such as scepticism or the authority of morals and norms) and traditions like metaphysics. Stocker's Derrida is someone who has something to say on a vast array of issues in philosophy. What we don't get, however, is an overall view of why Derrida's thought is one of the major philosophical innovations of the 20th century. Commenting for example on Foucault's critique of humanism Stocker remarks that: "Derrida does not endorse the most radical elements of Foucault's formulations, but does argue against any notion of autonomous transparent consciousness and of philosophy as directed toward a goal of ideal community" (141). Derrida's position here can hardly be seen as a radical new philosophical innovation since most of the major figures in the history of philosophy since Descartes put the meditations in print have criticised the idea of the "transparency of consciousness". In attempting to elaborate this view over the next couple of pages, a brief and not very convincing account of why Kant and Hegel have to be understood as metaphysical humanists is offered. Derrida's position is then said to be in contrast to these views and also to have influenced post-colonial theory. The compressed and summary nature of the treatment of both Derrida's position and his critique of these figures in the history of philosophy does not bring out the subtlety of his position or his criticism.

One of the difficulties of understanding Derrida's project -- and Stocker spells this out clearly in the introduction -- is that his thought is revealed for the most part through the way he reads the philosophical tradition. Stocker's book fails to show how Deconstruction emerges from Derrida's reading of Plato, Hegel and so on. This is a serious problem with writing on Derrida, particularly on his early works, since his position emerges from very detailed examinations of key texts and thinkers. If one cannot reproduce that subtlety, then Derrida appears to have mere variations on standard positions on some of the key notions that interest him, e.g. difference and identity. In order to understand Deconstruction, we need to see exactly how Derrida's project emerges from the way in which he reads texts against themselves. Stocker gives some indication of how this can be done in his treatment of Derrida's reading of Levinas in the chapter on values. In the case for example of Derrida's reading of Hegel, what Stocker needs to show is that Derrida is aware that Hegel is anti-Cartesian, but that in spite of this, if we read the Phenomenology or the Philosophy of Right in a certain way, then the real tendency in Cartesian thought -- presence -- shows itself to be a constitutive feature of Hegel's thought and in so doing Hegel undercuts and disrupts Hegel's own explicit anti-Cartesianism. One might disagree with Derrida's reading of Hegel or other figures in the history of philosophy, but he gives a serious, rigorous and detailed analysis that demands consideration and it is only in that engagement that one can glean what is at stake in Deconstruction.

Despite the host of figures and movements that Stocker examines to make sense of Deconstruction, he does manage to give a pretty good account of the influence of Saussure, Husserl and Structuralism on the development of Derrida's thought. One of the strengths of the book is that it manages to show the influence of numerous figures on Derrida's thought rather than, as some works on Derrida have done, go to extraordinary lengths to show that his thought is primarily written under the influence of one figure -- usually Husserl or Heidegger.

Derrida and Deconstruction offers almost no debate with the most well known figures in Derrida scholarship (such as Gasché, Bennington and Caputo) or with the various and often competing ways of understanding his thought -- such as reading him as a quasi-transcendental philosopher. Much of the first two-thirds of the book responds to the standard ill-informed analytic criticism of him as a relativist, as a linguistic idealist and so on, and then tries to defend him from these criticisms. But the defences of him against these charges are not developed in detail and are not adequately argued. Had the author, in the first five chapters, spent less time trying to placate the prejudices against Derrida of an imagined analytic reader and taken a stand on what he takes Derrida's project to be, it would have been be much more likely that the author would have established the core problems and concepts of Deconstruction. Short paragraphs and a series of statements of Derrida's position on various positions in epistemology and metaphysics do not add up to a view of what exactly Derrida is doing. Some of the early chapters do introduce some of Derrida's terminology, such as the supplement, but it is not until the last chapter that key terms like différance and the trace, which are at the heart of Deconstruction, are dealt with in any detail. But even in these cases, as with the earlier discussions of sovereignty and humanism, those concepts are not elaborated in sufficient depth such that one could get a sense of the originality of Derrida's position.

A final comment on style. While the language used in this book is not weighed down with technical vocabulary the book does not read well. There are innumerable poorly-worded and clumsy sentences and many typographical and grammatical errors, all of which should have been picked up by the publisher. One can speculate that the writing and the production process were unduly expedited in order to make the most of interest in Derrida following his death.