Derrida on Time

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Joanna Hodge, Derrida on Time, Routledge, 2007, 256pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415430913.

Reviewed by Linnell Secomb, University of Greenwich


Delving into the nuances and gradations of conceptual constructions while also recalling the far horizons of philosophical reflections -- from Aristotle to Derrida and friends -- Derrida and Time moves between intricate detailed readings and expansive historical overview. The text invokes the mutual readings that Hodge also identifies as the friendship of 'Blanchot, Levinas, [and] Derrida and their continuing points of reference: Aristotle, Augustine, Nietzsche; Hegel, Husserl, Heidegger' (92) not to mention Kant, Freud, Nancy, Marion, among many others. While explicating the transformations articulated across and between these various textual engagements, Hodge traces these theorists' reflections on temporality and time. This book demands an oscillating reading that returns back and forth between chapters, paragraphs, concepts, and phrases creating a disrupted and repeated engagement. There is a clearly discernable trajectory but there is also a looping return such that later insights recall, re-signify and rearticulate earlier observations. This returning is not a restating but a retrospective materializing of that which had already emerged: what the reader might have overlooked earlier attains a new significance in the context of later explications. This encourages or demands a non-linear reading so that later sections invite, even require, a revisiting of the earlier.

This circling effect imitates the conception of time that gradually unfolds throughout the text. The book thereby performs that which it postulates, so that the structure of the writing and the elaboration of the concepts impersonate and replicate each other. The act of reading thus iterates the concept of time that unfurls through that reading. Without being able to sufficiently encapsulate either the writerly effect or the conceptual reach of the book in the short space of this commentary, I would like to trace an instance of this oscillating and spiralling effect of the time of the text.

At the centre of Derrida on Time is a reading of Levinas and Heidegger on time complicated and interrupted by Derrida and Blanchot. Responding to Heidegger's formulation of a temporality structured by the finitude of death-bound subjectivity, Levinas advances a temporality activated by engagement with the other, a temporality of the immemorial and the infinite. As Hodge makes clear, Levinas's concept of alterity implies not just a heterogeneity but also a ruptured temporality that recasts time as infinity.

While Heidegger does not overlook Mitsein, the foci of his investigations are the possibilities of Dasein and how Dasein is to be understood as distinct from Mitsein. Hodge explains that:

Heidegger's question is not so much about how meaning can be determinate, but incomplete, but rather with how instances of Dasein can separate themselves, as Selbstsein, being a self, from the collective experiences of a historical location or situation, as fallen being with, Mitsein, and being with others, Mitdasein. (104)

In Being and Time temporality is understood in relation to the mortality and finitude of Dasein as a being-toward-death. While, as Hodge clarifies, Heidegger's later writings complicate this picture, Levinas challenges the general orientation of Heideggerian time through his construction of time in relation to the encounter with the other. Hodge writes:

These various [Heideggerian] accounts of time are challenged by Levinas, in favour of an overtly disjunctive thinking of time, in the arrival of the face of the other, which interrupts sameness and totality … This requires a recognition of a more basic thinking of time and temporality as a trace of otherness, not susceptible to thematisation, as object of intending consciousness. (105)

This Levinasian disruption not only challenges a successive or uninterrupted time but also questions the understanding of the subject, for the conception of time as duration attributes a continuous identity to the subject whereas the disjunctive time of the relation to the other inaugurates the subject as 'constituted in response to the arrival of alterity' (107).

Eschewing this seeming dichotomy, between Heideggerian finitude and Levinasian infinity, Derrida deploys another conception of time that opens to the future or that, as Hodge later writes, is a 'system of differences held in place by the finitude which is infinite differance' (213). Derrida, Hodge proposes: 'in effect borrows from Levinas the conception of interruption, of the a-dieu and of an immemorial past, out of which the thought of divinity arrives, in order to install a conception of a future which is not foreclosed' (102). As Hodge explains, however, Derrida's transformation of Levinas's concept of the immemorial past into that of the a-venir or indeterminate future enables 'the competing accounts of the primordiality of time as finite, or as infinite' (102) to remain undecided.

While questioning Levinas's commitment to a determined conception of time as infinite Derrida nevertheless engages with Levinas's understanding of alterity and its associated concept of the trace. The trace Derrida suggests designates 'the past that has never been present' (cited by Hodge, 111). Hodge points to the connection and distinction between Levinas and Freud that Derrida marks in his elaboration in 'Differance' where Derrida writes:

A past that has never been present: with this formula Emmanuel Levinas designates (in ways that are, to be sure, not those of psychoanalysis) the trace and the enigma of absolute alterity … And the concept of trace like that of differance, forms -- across these different traces and through these differences between traces, as understood by Nietzsche, Freud and Levinas … -- the network that sums up and permeates our 'epoch' as the de-limitation of ontology (of presence). (cited by Hodge, 111)

Like and unlike Freud, Levinas, Derrida observes, puts in question the philosophy of presence through his conception of the trace as a never present past or as the immemorial.

At the conclusion of Derrida on Time Hodge returns to Freud, explaining Derrida's interest in the temporality of the non-temporal unconscious. While Freud insists on the non-temporal character of the unconscious, Derrida avers that this is only so 'from the standpoint of a certain vulgar conception of time' (cited by Hodge, 206). Derrida is intrigued by the operation of delay and non-presence in the unconscious which is, as Hodge explains, the result of a process through which 'The print or impression … is … in some sense prior to … the expression, in which that impression then comes into expression' (206-7). This structure 'disrupts the logic of the before and after' as 'an expression retroactively bring[s] a prior impression into existence' (207). The Freudian unconscious material is only given content retroactively when a later event triggers a recollection of an earlier impression that until the later moment had as yet had no significance. As Derrida writes:

There is no unconscious truth to be discovered by virtue of having been written elsewhere. There is no text written and present elsewhere which would then be subjected, without being changed in the process, to an operation and a temporalization … which would be external to it, floating on the surface. There is no present text in general, and there is not even a past present text, a text which is past as having been present. The text is not conceivable in an originary or modified form of presence. (cited by Hodge, 207)

Despite Levinas's antagonism to Freud a similar structure of originary non-presence may be identified here. Derrida defines Levinas's concept of the trace as 'a past that has never been present', while he conceives of Freud's unconscious in similar terms, suggesting that 'There is no present text in general, and there is not even a past present text, a text which is past as having been present'. Though not reducible to each other, there is here, in Derrida's reading of these two processes, the emergence of a similar architecture of temporality that disrupts the chronology of before and after and suggests the commingling of disparate moments in the constitution of significations.

Derrida, Hodge suggests, rearticulates these two conceptions, of a divine immemorial trace in the one case, and of the unconscious in the other, to reflect on the operation of delay and deferral in the constitution of meaning. Following an extended analysis of Derrida's readings of Freud and Levinas, Hodge writes that for Derrida:

History is the series of loopings, whereby subsequent registrations of impressions shift the meanings and even transform the inscription systems into something other than they were. Necessity gives way to the happenstance of such deflection and of the chance of its inscription being noted. The absolute passage installs a priority to a certain chance of deflection, detour and drift. (213)

This structure of postponement operates also in Derrida on Time as these concluding reflections prompt a return to the section titled 'In the beginning' where Hodge has already commented on Freud. In a brief reflection, almost in passing, Hodge refers to the postal effect that Derrida identifies in 'Envois', the opening epistorary section of The Post Card. Here, conjoining Freud with Heidegger, Derrida identifies the possibility of non-arrival and of delay, writing: 'The master thinkers are also masters of the post. Knowing well how to play with poste restante … The post is also en reste, and always restante. It awaits the addressee who might always, by chance, not arrive' (Derrida qtd in Hodge, 9).

There is always the possibility of a non-arrival. There is, Hodge affirms, already, at the outset: 'a retrieval into the present of contents, affects, impressions or originary meanings, for which there is no definite previous time of registration' (9). The post restante is not simply a failure to arrive and a return but is also the possibility that the retrospective expression of prior impression may not be enacted unless the later event gives signification to that past that was never present. Hodge's encapsulation of Derrida's Freud 'In the beginning' comes to expression by the end as an early sign of Derrida's re-articulation of temporality as a retrieval of the never present. In the section titled 'In the beginning' Hodge writes of 'the mode of the after-impact, which marks the arrival in consciousness of a recognition of an affect, or concept, previously imprinted in some register other than that of conscious awareness' (8). At the close, which I want to suggest is also the looping back to the beginning of this text, this observation itself registers as an after-impact now indicating Derrida's re-articulation of temporality as 'a series of loopings, whereby subsequent registrations of impressions shift the meanings and even transform the inscription systems into something other than they were' (213).

Derrida on Time explores the conversions and rearticulations of temporality enacted in conversations between these philosophical friends, identifying the traces that inhere in Derrida's concepts of the avenir and elucidating how this futurity is held open by the structure of a history whose contents are always only accessible through events that are to come. This book entwines these various philosophical voices, enacting not just the complexity of a nonlinear temporality but also revealing the philosophical distinctions and the conjunctions that have jointly re-articulated time. Hodge does not just describe this conversation but extends the discussion, bringing to expression deflected traces and postponed impressions of earlier philosophical reflections now given signification though their articulation. This is not a book for the faint-hearted, but it is a book that rewards close and repeated re-engagement.