Derrida: Profanations

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Patrick O'Connor, Derrida: Profanations, Continuum, 2010, 206pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441181701.

Reviewed by Teresa Villa-Ignacio, Harvard University


In this volume, Patrick O'Connor makes the compelling argument that Derrida's fifty-year writing career was dedicated to a philosophy of profanation. As the key operation of deconstruction, profanation entails both a laying bare of the constructedness or profane character of anything deemed sacred and enables an exploration of the significance of profanation as a ubiquitous existential and relational condition. O'Connor engages with an impressive range of texts by Derrida and the philosophers who have come before and after him. He argues that Derrida's critiques of Husserlian phenomenology, Hegelian temporality, Heideggarian ontology, Levinasian alterity, and Christian charity, as well as Derrida's own ethical and political philosophies, are all articulations of ubiquitous profanation, finitization, contingency, and the potential contamination of any identity by all other identities. The book also includes relevant comparisons of Derridean arguments with those of his contemporaries, including Agamben, Žižek, and Badiou, among others.

The author notes that his book shares many affinities with Leonard Lawlor's Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomonology and Martin Hägglund's Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life, and he candidly situates his work as a critique of the ethical, religious, and messianic turns in Derridean studies. While students of religious studies, ethical philosophy, and political philosophy may be most interested in the chapters specifically addressing their fields, those interested in Derridean studies and continental philosophy in general will be intrigued by O'Connor's tracing of profanation as an argumentative thread running from the early to the late Derrida.

In the first chapter, O'Connor examines the relationship between deconstruction and Husserlian phenomenology to reveal how deconstruction aligns itself with phenomenology's critique of metaphysics, yet also goes beyond phenomenology to demonstrate how phenomenology still relies on metaphysical assumptions. He emphasizes the importance of Husserl's concept of the epoché as an antecedent to such concepts as différance and spectrality. According to O'Connor, for Derrida the interest of the epoché is not its determination of the phenomenality or reality of things, but rather the condition of spectrality that gives rise to such a determination. Rather than think the epoché as a transcendent, otherworldly suspension of the world, O'Connor argues that for Derrida there is no "other-world," but rather, other worlds, and thinking occurs precisely at the points where worlds intersect. Furthermore, for Derrida, the epoché is not an exceptional event but rather a ubiquitous, ongoing process. By pointing outside the world, the epoché reveals the finitude of the world, and thus also opens up the possibility of the not-world, a "world without world that is not necessarily other-worldly per se," which O'Connor identifies as the spectral in Derrida (31). This chapter ends with comments on Derrida's work on touch as an intersection of worlds.

The second chapter focuses on the relationship between finitude and temporality in Derrida's readings of Hegel. Finding Hegel's definition of the world as an aggregate of finitudes problematic, Derrida views the structure of the world rather "as a relation between finitudes" (40). Infinity, O'Connor argues, makes Hegelian dialectics possible because it can incorporate both the same and the other; it can include everything in its system, and all antagonisms between a same and an other can be recuperated by it and interpreted as part of its truth (42). While Hegel warns, however, against the tendency of the human intellect toward the bad infinite, which sets itself in opposition to finitudes and does not recognize infinity as "immanent to all forms of finitude" (43), Rodolphe Gasché finds the bad infinite productive, for, through its perpetual positing of other finitudes to which it opposes itself, it makes possible "infinite finitude," as a "finite alterity" (44).

O'Connor brings this "ubiquity of finitude" to bear on the inextricable relations between temporality and spatiality as at once finite conditions and indicators of finitude (44). He points to Derrida's focus on the trace as "a trace of other finitudes" (46) that both requires and makes manifest the finitude of space and time: to be precise, the trace marks the distance between other spaces as time, therefore, time itself is spacing (espacement) (47). Reading Hägglund on Derrida, O'Connor views this spacing as the condition for the perception of the existence of worlds and life itself as infinite finitization. O'Connor identifies différance as the process of tracing "relations between identities" through space and time: "the experience of every event is necessarily founded upon a temporal experience of delay (time) and deferral (space)" (48). To think the plurality of finitudes made possible through différance, O'Connor coins the term "whatever-finitudes" (50). The chapter ends with an examination of the importance of Artaud's theater of cruelty for Derrida. Artaud's recognition of the irony of the creator model of theater, in which the theatrical creation is presented as if it had not been created and seeks to be convincing in its presence through the invisibility of its production, serves Derrida's own critique of presence.

Arriving at the heart of the book's argument, the third chapter examines Derrida's deconstruction of the notion of the sacred, particularly by contrasting Derrida with Heidegger and Levinas. O'Connor argues that, whereas the sacred sets itself apart from the world, that is, posits itself as immune to the world, deconstruction recognizes that "all identities are auto-immune," that is, constitutively self-contestatory (61). Furthermore, he finds Derrida to hold a more radical view of alterity than Levinas, who focuses above all on human alterity, or Heidegger, who is most interested in "the sacrality of things" (63). Derrida, O'Connor argues, leaves everything open to alterity, not limiting it to "things or to persons" (66). In O'Connor's view, Heidegger remains a metaphysicist in that he conceives of the sacred as an origin whose self-absenting gives rise to Being.

Unlike Heidegger, Levinas is uninterested in the relationship between faith and things: for him, faith has to do with beings and that which in them transcends being; however, Derrida's critique of Levinas is that the alterity of the Other is made possible by the (alterity of the) thingness of the other. In this vein, O'Connor argues that Derrida deconstructs Levinas' view of the human face as exceptional, for the appearance of the face "relies on a general experience of appearing" that encompasses the appearance of the face and of those things that are other to the face; therefore, Derrida envisions a "'horizontal' otherness" that "contaminates" Levinas' "vertical otherness" (72). O'Connor views Derrida's later concept of "hauntology" as an advancement beyond Heideggerian ontology and Levinasian alterity. Invoking the statement "tout autre et tout autre" and its various possible meanings from The Gift of Death, O'Connor focuses on the translation "each and every other is wholly other or every bit other" to delineate the mutually permeating relationships of sameness and otherness between beings. He also points to Derrida's deconstruction of the Levinasian privilege of ethics over politics to show how the relation to the other always already entails a "contamination" by the context of the relation to the third. O'Connor finally builds on the arguments in this chapter to assert that all alterity is profane, and therefore everything is profane.

The chapter concludes with a comparison of Derrida's views with those expressed in Agamben's Profanations: for Agamben, like Derrida, while religion, and therefore sacrality, involve separation and setting apart, profanation reintroduces neutrality and disinterest to separation. However, Agamben retains a vestige of the sacred in his thinking about the mingling of profane time and sacred, eternal time (chronos and aeon) in human messianism or redemption (81-82).

In Chapter Four, "The Deconstruction of Christianity," O'Connor offers a solid critique of the figure of charity that permeates all of Christianity, from the everyday acts of Christians offering charity to the poor, to the charity of God sacrificing himself for all humanity in the form of Christ dying to redeem the sins of all. Reading Derrida's Given Time, O'Connor observes that everyday acts of charity perpetuate existing social hierarchies; that is, by keeping the poor out of sight and out of the home, charity ironically participates in a complicity with a system of social inequality it superficially appears to critique. Charity, he therefore argues, is incompatible with hospitality, which, as "an apt expression of deconstruction," opens the home and puts the very notion of home itself at risk (90-91). Even when taking into account the "radicality of charity" as expounded by scholars of the Christian tradition such as Ivan Illich and Klaus Held, O'Connor finds that charity ubiquitously separates those giving and those given to, those who participate in charity and those who don't.

He engages in a compelling analysis of the sacrifice of Christ, the central act of charity for the Christian faith which, in an act of double irony, both abolishes a hierarchy of sacred and profane and yet sets a hierarchy of the sacred and the profane into motion. That is, by substituting himself for all humankind, God negates hierarchy, yet the figure of Christ also participates in the reinforcement of social hierarchies, since Christ's death takes place in order for him to redeem all, to assure everyone a place in paradise, a place of "salvage and refuge" (97). Having performed this deconstruction of Christianity, O'Connor critiques John D. Caputo's association of deconstruction with Christianity and liberal values in What Would Jesus Deconstruct? as an example of those who subscribe to the messianic turn in Derrida studies. O'Connor argues in concluding this chapter that the "reciprocal symmetry" sought by Christianity in its directive to "love your neighbor as yourself" is deconstructed by the recognition that all charity takes place under non-immune conditions: "to love one's neighbor can no longer accomplish the security of the neighborhood, since the neighbor already bears traces of radical insecurity at its core" (107).

The fifth chapter argues that the demonstration of deconstruction as profanation necessarily extends to Derrida's writings on ethics, and foregrounds the relation of this argument to other critical readings of Derridean ethics. O'Connor pays special attention to Žižek, for whom Derrida's preoccupation with the other amounts to a fetishization of the other that ultimately reappropriates the other within the logic of the same and makes impossible any actual ethical relation with the other or political intervention on behalf of the other. O'Connor argues that, while Žižek's critiques provide a useful approach to thinking about Derrida and ethics, he (O'Connor) must argue beyond Žižek's arguments, for, as in all other aspects of Derrida's work, ethics is "essentially contingent and open to finitization" (111). O'Connor finds that Žižek, like other critics, overly associates Derrida's work with Levinas's, specifically by construing the Derridean other as pure; whereas O'Connor finds Derridean alterity to be structured by a "contaminative logic" (116). Furthermore, he argues that Žižek views Derridean alterity primarily in terms of the Levinasian face, whereas O'Connor sees Derridean alterity as a "general alterity" (117).

Bringing this analysis of alterity to bear on decision making, O'Connor notes that for Derrida "a decision always depends on some others" (118, my emphasis), that is, it always takes place in the context of a plurality of possibilities, and, furthermore, it always necessarily exceeds them. Reading The Gift of Death, O'Connor argues that the relation foregrounded in an ethical decision is not that of the self to God, but of the self to others, the fact that everyone is contingent on everyone else. The singularity of each and every ethical decision supports his argument that everyone and everything is open to profanation, and indeed, "ethics are impossible" (120). Community is therefore also impossible, for relations that are always being reinvented cannot give rise to the "ideal form of tranquility or unanimity" that is community (121). He takes issue with Caputo's and Mark Dooley's uses of Derrida to argue for a fragmentary kind of community, which O'Connor characterizes as liberalist in that it is interested in maintaining difference as an inviolable value.

The sixth and final chapter examines the roles of freedom and equality in Derrida's political philosophy. Synthesizing arguments on the relation between politics and temporality from Rogues, Specters of Marx, and "Force of Law," O'Connor demonstrates that for Derrida any political promise must be open to profanation, must defer to a yet-to-come. O'Connor reminds his readers that democracy (demos) is the rule of the many, not the rule of all; therefore, exclusion and inequality are always present in democracy, and the valorization of equality exists to compensate for this tendency toward inequality. What Derrida names "democracy-to-come" is the condition of democracy, and that which conditions democracy's auto-immunity: "democracy is self-suicidal: it 'maintains itself and protects itself by limiting and threatening itself'" (141). Relatedly, democracy-to-come is so because it always depends on deferral -- "the next election, the previous election, the forthcoming preliminary and so forth" (142). O'Connor describes the relationship between the processes of democracy-to-come and deconstruction thus: democracy-to-come consists of an open-ended number of finite testings of equality, and such frequent testing of equality requires the context of freedom; deconstruction makes possible the freedom in which each instance of equality may be contested (144).

O'Connor seizes upon Derrida's recognition of the exposure of all to violence as a condition for the possibility of democracy in order to argue that freedom and equality can never be gifts, they must always entail a price; any positing of them as gifts must always entail corruption, must always entail more than one (le plus d'un) (147). Furthermore, absolute sovereignty always goes along with the possibility of rebellion, and absolute sovereignty is always profane because it is open to profanation. Interestingly, O'Connor addresses issues of deconstruction's "political efficacy" and argues against possible associations of deconstruction with Realpolitik and global capitalism (148-49). He valorizes Derrida's vision of ethics and politics over contemporary philosophies seeking to "construct politics of solidarity." Taking Badiou as a negative example, O'Connor points out that Badiou sees the event as not of this world; therefore Badiou is advocating a "politics of immortality" (150). Furthermore, for Badiou, the event is rare, whereas Derrida points toward "much more radical and frequent usurpation" as well as "the ubiquity of the finite and finitization" (151). Derrida emerges as the more practical philosopher, or the philosopher more attuned to the everyday. Comparing Laclau's On Populist Reason more favorably to Derrida's vision of politics, O'Connor notes that both rely on an understanding of identity as undecidable and remain committed to endless difference and conflict.

Derrida: Profanations at once condenses an enormous range of philosophical content into two hundred pages and offers an exciting reconceptualization of Derrida's œuvre. Yet by so persistently arguing that the essence of deconstruction is the profanation of any and all essences, O'Connor regrettably de-emphasizes the flavor of the profane in Derrida's writing and tends toward an essentialization of his own. It may be that these choices were made in the hope of appealing to a larger readership. From this reviewer's perspective, however, future discussions of deconstruction as profanation would do well to foreground Derrida's attentiveness to the singularities of language and to the literary text as a singular, profane instance always already engaged in deconstructing the sacred.

Also notable is O'Connor's choice to organize the book around the deconstructive critique of Christianity as the source of the most influential political theology, monarchical sovereignty, in the west. Now, while the importance of Derrida's Jewish background to his philosophy is never directly addressed in the book (a move that perhaps indirectly critiques what the author may view as an overemphasis on messianism in Derrida studies), scholars pursuing this view of deconstruction as profanation may find it worthwhile to include considerations of Derrida's Judaism and judéité in their arguments.

The vast trajectory of O'Connor's argument offers many more points of departure for comparative and interdisciplinary studies of Derrida's writing as profanation. The volume is thoroughly useful for relating deconstruction as a post-phenomenological philosophy to historical materialism, and may serve as an exciting springboard for dialogue between materialists and messianists, as well as for reconfigurations of identity politics of race, class, and gender, among others. It will also be interesting to see how this philosophy of profanation will itself open toward, and give way to, profanations-to-come.