Derrida's Voice and Phenomenon

Placeholder book cover

Vernon W. Cisney, Derrida's Voice and Phenomenon, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 254pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748644209.

Reviewed by Neal De Roo, Dordt College


In graduate school, I made the mistake of putting Derrida's Voice and Phenomenon (back then still called Speech and Phenomenon) on the reading list for my doctoral comprehensive exam. As I plowed through the dense text multiple times trying to unpack the many layers of meaning hidden in its succinct argumentation, I was terrified about what questions could arise in the oral exam. "To really understand this book," I remember saying to a friend, "I'd need to understand pretty much everything that Derrida's about and the entirety of Husserl's project as well. I don't know how I'll get this ready by my comps -- in fact, I feel like I will have had a successful career if I can ever say I 'get' everything that's going on in Voice and Phenomenon."

That is to say that Voice and Phenomenon (VP) is an immensely difficult text, though also a very important one for the study of phenomenology, deconstruction and/or post-structuralism. Despite its importance, its difficulty has always prevented me from teaching it to undergraduate students. It just seemed too difficult to ask undergraduates -- especially those that lack significant philosophical background or training -- to wade through a work this dense.

But then I learned of Vernon W. Cisney's Derrida's Voice and Phenomenon. As an Edinburgh Philosophical Guide, the book aims to provide "readers new to philosophical classics . . . help with reading those key texts" (from the "Series Editor's Preface," x). As such, it functions as a guide book to be read alongside Derrida's text, not a summary to be read in place of it.

And a masterful guide it is. It is laid out quite simply. After a brief introduction that tries to help readers know why they ought to read "this book" (both VP and Cisney's guide to it), there follow three chapters: one outlining the historical context in which the book was written; a second -- by far the largest -- that walks the reader through VP chapter by chapter (at times almost page by page or line by line); and a concluding chapter of "Study Aids" that includes a glossary of key terms from VP, some recommendations for further reading for those who want to learn more about Derrida and his relation to Husserl, and a brief elaboration of some key concepts in Derrida's later work that are foreshadowed by the arguments in VP.

The first chapter's introduction to the historical context in which VP was written is a major strength of the book. It provides a concise but immensely helpful summary of the origins of the phenomenological movement in the question of the 'crisis of foundations' for mathematical objectivity (15-18). This not only provides a helpful background for the importance that ideality will have in VP, but it also provides a unifying theme to the Husserlian corpus which can otherwise seem quite disparate. Husserl's first book on the philosophy of arithmetic is often downplayed, if not outright ignored, by scholars of phenomenology, who prefer to act as if Husserl's philosophy begins with Logical Investigations. By situating Husserl's thought against the backdrop of the question of mathematical objectivity, Cisney is able to provide a compelling account of the debate between Husserl and Frege on Sinn and Bedeutung that, in many ways, launches the division between the 'Analytic' and 'Continental' streams of Western philosophy (18-26). As such, Cisney is able to clearly and helpfully explain the history of a division that flummoxes a great many students new to philosophy (and many seasoned scholars in the field as well!).

After presenting this historical background, Cisney provides introductions to some key concepts in Husserlian philosophy that Derrida will engage in VP: indication and expression (26-29), the living present (29-32), the 'principle of principles' (32-36), and the problem of intersubjectivity (36-39). From there, Cisney traces the effect that Heidegger has on French interpretations of Husserl (39-44), which then yields a dual reception of Husserl within French thought in the mid-20th-century: the subjective and the conceptual (47). In the subjective stream, one finds the existentialist philosophies of Sartre and (the early) Merleau-Ponty (44-47). In the conceptual stream, one finds the work of Bachelard, Cavaillès, Canguilhem, and (the later) Merleau-Ponty (47-49). While the subjective stream of phenomenology dominated the French intellectual scene through the 30s and 40s, the conceptual stream -- with its de-emphasis on the lived experience of the subject and its increased emphasis on "the epistemological breaks and structural formations accompanying the emergence of bodies of knowledge" (48) -- sets the stage for the structuralist philosophies that dominated the 50s and (early) 60s (49-51). It is out of this complex of phenomenological and structuralist heritage that both decon-struct-ion and post-structural-ism emerge (51).

This chapter on historical context may be the book's best feature. This is not a critique of the book's summary of VP's argumentation so much as an admission that the introduction is extremely useful to anyone trying to set the stage for contemporary French thought. In 41 pages, Cisney lays out the backdrop against which deconstruction, post-structuralism, and the 'theological turn' in French phenomenology make sense. I suspect this introduction will become compulsory reading in any undergraduate course on contemporary thought that I teach from now on, and I recommend it as such to others as well.

The second chapter is the heart of Cisney's book. It lays out, in sequential fashion, the overall argument of VP. It sub-divides its sections according to the chapters of Derrida's work to make it easy to follow along with that text (the length of these sections -- approximately fifteen pages each -- also works very well to assign alongside the chapter for one class period of study). Cisney's guide provides background on key words and figures that Derrida uses (especially helpful, given Derrida's propensity for using untranslated German, Greek, or Latin words in his work) and unpacks the very dense chain of reasoning that Derrida employs in VP.

For the most part, Cisney's explications of Derrida's arguments are very well done. Especially helpful are his explanations of Derrida's enigmatic introduction to VP (57-72), where he explains the distinction between introductions that provide "something of a historical précis . . . [that] is required only in order to contextualize the author's argument and see its significance" versus those that "In an extremely truncated manner . . . [present] the most significant elements of the entire work" (57). He then shows how Derrida employs both strategies in his introduction, which is why "the 'Introduction' to Voice and Phenomenon is perhaps one of the most difficult parts of the book" (58). Many a reader approaching VP for the first time has floundered on the rocks of this introduction and has given up on the rest of the book because of it. Cisney's explanation gives those readers something to hold on to -- as well as hope that the book will get easier.

Of course, 'easier' is taken in a loose sense here. Nothing about VP is 'easy' reading, but with Cisney's help it at least becomes manageable for the first-time reader.[1] Cisney's ability to explain the theme of 'life' and 'death' that runs throughout the book is also particularly helpful, as that is a theme that I myself have struggled with in previous readings. By making explicit the connection between Derrida's various discussions of 'death' and the centrality of 'life' to Husserl's phenomenology (e.g., the living present, lived experience, life-world, etc.), the relationship between this line of reasoning and the overall project of VP emerges more clearly. In fact, Cisney helps to show how "a reformulation of the question of life itself" is "likely the central challenge of Voice and Phenomenon" (64). Other notably helpful things for which Cisney deserves utmost credit include his explanations of: the various types or relations to the 'outside' at work in Derrida's exploration of Husserl's account of meaning as soliloquy (89-90); the phenomenology of language that Derrida performs in that same chapter (96-97); the 'structural scheme' of deconstruction (113-114); the notion of consciousness at use in (Derrida's reading of) Husserl (154); how the sign-intention relation mirrors the body-soul relation that lies at the heart of the metaphysics of presence (155-156); the analogies he uses to help explain Derrida's notion of the 'originative supplement' (175); and his definitions of key terms such as the metaphysics of presence (61), trace (131) and différance (134). Throughout the second chapter, Cisney walks slowly through the text, giving readers what they need to make sense of what they're reading and why it matters.

The third chapter is then meant to provide study aids for the new reader. The glossary is generally helpful (if somewhat wordy), and his suggestions for recommended reading are fairly good. One can always quibble with lists of that type (I would probably have included John D. Caputo's Deconstruction in a Nutshell as another good introduction to Derrida, for example), but all of the books Cisney lists are defensible and would help the reader new to Derrida come to learn more. The last half of the chapter includes extended definitions/explorations of some concepts that are rooted already in Derrida's early thought but do not emerge explicitly until later (e.g., animality, justice, responsibility, aporia, etc.). Cisney justifies well his inclusion of this section, but it is not clear to me that new readers would be able to understand these concepts from Cisney's descriptions alone. The exploration of justice, in particular, strikes me as overly wordy and so potentially bewildering to new readers. Whether the fault for this lies with Cisney or with Derrida is not easy to determine.

While the book is an excellent guide overall, and one I heartily recommend, it is not without flaws. These are relatively minor, and I include them here mainly in the hope of their being remedied in a future edition. First, in the discussion of Derrida's chapter "Meaning and Representation," Cisney explains the various ways that Husserl uses (and Derrida exploits) "representation." He highlights three distinct but related German words that can be translated "representation" (108). This was helpful, but underdeveloped; new readers would be better served with a longer discussion of these various senses, given the importance that they play in Derrida's argument, not just in that chapter but in later ones as well.

In addition, I found that italics and summaries were both overused throughout the text. I found the use of italics distracting. In addition, they were used so often that they didn't adequately indicate key terms. I also thought that the number of summaries scattered throughout the guide to the text -- while helpful in theory -- became distracting and burdensome, adding extra reading to what could have been done more succinctly and therefore (perhaps) more clearly. However, I should say that my students were divided on these issues: some agreed with my assessment, but others found the use of italics very helpful in picking out key words and phrases to provide a sort of quick-scan-outline of the chapters. Some also found the summaries to be very helpful in reminding us of how the overall argument hangs together in particular places or with particular details (though others thought that they made the book longer and wordier than it needed to be).

The students were nearly unanimous, however, in one complaint: they wished for more visual aids to help in their understandings. Diagrams (such as those showing the various distinctions and how they relate to each other, or how the various elements of the philosophical heritage came together to produce the context in which VP was written), charts (comparing the various uses of "representation", for example), and tables (e.g., to trace a theme throughout the book) were all mentioned as things that could have both aided the first-time reader in understanding and provided visual stimulation to keep the reader's attention in a book that is, admittedly, rather esoteric and dry.

Philosophically, my only big concern is with Cisney's presentation of Husserl's theory of internal time-consciousness. It overly focused on Husserl's early attempts and almost entirely ignored the later breakthroughs centered around protention. This is important because those later breakthroughs bolster Derrida's claims about temporalization in VP. Given that the book is about Derrida's reading of Husserl in VP and that in that work Derrida deals mainly with Husserl's early attempts, perhaps Cisney felt that adding too much of the later details would have overly confused the issue (though when I brought those later elements to my class's attention, it helped students better understand Derrida's claims). Still, I would like to have seen Husserl's time-consciousness theory better represented, at least in the glossary entries for 'retention' and 'protention' in chapter three, which shade very heavily into a representationalized version of those concepts that is not only inaccurate to Husserl's later work, but also threaten to undermine the distinction between representation and retention that is key to Derrida's argument in VP.

Despite these minor qualms, overall Cisney is very successful in achieving what he sets out to do. As a scholar in the field, I found the book helpful and at times even enlightening. But more importantly, while I can't say that my students found the book (or VP) easy, I can confidently say that, after reading Cisney, they understood the general argument of VP, something I do not think they would have been able to do without his guidance. I don't know if they would have been able to do it with Cisney's guidance alone -- apart from class discussions, that is -- but that is almost undoubtedly the fault of Derrida's dense argumentation and not Cisney's explanations of it. His book functions as an excellent guide to VP and should open that text up to readers at a much earlier stage of philosophical development than was previously possible.

[1] At least, according to my Contemporary Philosophy students. Thanks to my PHIL 304 class -- Jenna Arkema, Mason Davis, Whitney Dooyema, Jessica Harvey, Jon Janssen, Jahn Kuiper, and Kyle Roelofs -- for being willing to be my guinea pigs as I tried out this book, and for sharing their thoughts on the book with me. You will find their thoughts scattered throughout this review, especially near the end.