Descartes: A Biography

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Desmond M. Clarke, Descartes: A Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 520pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521823013.

Reviewed by Karen Detlefsen, University of Pennsylvania


There has developed, in recent years, a small industry in the writing of philosophical biographies -- books detailing the lives of great philosophers, providing background to the development of their thoughts, or describing the relationships between philosophers. Descartes scholarship is no exception, and Desmond Clarke's recently published biography joins other titles on Descartes published in the last decade or so by Stephen Gaukroger, Geneviève Rodis-Lewis, and Richard Watson.[1] Clarke's work is notable for its exhaustive detail, drawing helpfully upon Descartes' voluminous and revealing correspondence to reconstruct as best as possible Descartes' movements and mindsets throughout his almost 54 years of life. His focus is on Descartes' life, but he also provides succinct and accessible descriptions of the major developments in Descartes' philosophical thinking. Another virtue of the book is the context -- theological, political, social, and scientific -- that Clarke provides for the reader to better understand Descartes as a person and as an intellectual. This biography will appeal to the scholar of Descartes and the seventeenth century, as well as to other philosophers interested in the lives of the greatest thinkers in their profession's history. It is also appropriate for a lay reader keen on gaining insight into Descartes' contribution to philosophy and why he is considered to be such a pivotal figure in the history of the discipline.

Three related themes edge repeatedly to the forefront throughout the book. They are: first, Descartes' seemingly endless travels across the continent and his eventual isolation in voluntary exile; second, Descartes' own largely unflattering character; and third, the ubiquitous and sometimes menacing presence of religious authorities exercising an influence over Descartes' life and work, especially his scientific work.

The theme of travel emerges early in Clarke's book, and it persists to the end: "The fate of Descartes' remains reflects his life-long penchant for changing residence … " (412). While living, Descartes first left France in order to avoid one of the obvious careers for which his education had groomed him -- that of teacher, lawyer, or joining the clergy -- and he traveled for ten years (32-3). While he did continue his research during this time (33), one gets the sense that his journeys were unstructured and drifting (37, 93). Beeckman, one of his earliest close friends, "remarked, on one occasion, that Descartes suffered from wanderlust [peregrinandi cupidus]" (94). Descartes' portrayal, in the Discourse on Method, of his ten years of travel as quite purposeful seems, then, to have been a retrospective evaluation (94). Nonetheless, the time that Descartes spent out of France had an enormous impact on his thought and works. He saw travel as a replacement for study in schools and through books, of which he read few (35, 107, 177). Indeed, the fact that he owned very few books throughout his life certainly made it easier to move at the frantic pace he kept up (109). His aversion to the ideas of others extended to his avoidance of learned people (68). In fact, as he matured, he tended to avoid all contact with people, and his adult life was lived primarily in isolation.

Descartes'… frequent changes of address, and his almost obsessive efforts to conceal his precise location even from trusted friends, make [it plausible that his second departure from France was to avoid the customary distractions of a gentleman's life (such as visiting friends and attending court)]. (97)

So elusive was he that some spelled his name "Monsieur d'Escartes" (Mr. Evasion) (97). This frequent movement and his resulting isolation contributes to Clarke's characterization of Descartes as a lonely, yet somewhat unpleasant, figure: "He had become [by 1638] a reclusive, cantankerous, and oversensitive loner, who worried incessantly about his place in history and the priority he claimed for various discoveries" (180; see also 214, 249). It is true that Descartes slowed his pace of travel as he grew older; the winter of 1645-46 seems to have been a significant turning point in Descartes' life.

In contrast with the confident expectations of a long, healthy life and with the combative confrontations with almost all his correspondents that characterized the early 1640s, Descartes acknowledged a growing awareness of advancing years and a willingness to resile from controversy in 1645-46. Even his lifelong penchant for traveling seems to have abated … (317)

Still, even with the slowed pace, Descartes made two arduous (for one feeling the effects of his age as Descartes was [317, 337]) trips back to France (1647 and 1648) along with his final journey to Sweden in 1649. As one example of the many helpful extra-textual additions to the book, Clarke provides the reader with an appendix, complete with map, detailing Descartes' movements and residences throughout his life (Appendix 2, 421-23).

Descartes does not come across as an agreeable character in Clarke's biography. We are prepared for this by Clarke's introduction where he tells us of Descartes' "sensitivity to criticism and the certainty that he claimed, prematurely, for his own view", and draws our attention to the fact that Descartes "fought with almost everyone he encountered while constantly announcing that all he wanted was 'the security and tranquility' required to complete his intellectual projects" (5). Among his flaws, we learn of his lack of modesty (81), his paranoia and suspicion (for example, in believing that his private correspondence is being read before reaching its addressee (114)), his reluctance to concede intellectual points (159), his tendency to bear grudges (159), his duplicity (e.g. 197, 223, 382), and his manipulative treatment of people, even of supportive friends (231). It is no wonder, then, that "from Descartes' earliest days in the United Provinces, [it is clear] that he had a weakness for losing friends and, in the case of those who criticized him, for making permanent enemies" (307). While he acquired many acquaintances and some friends over the years, he could not seem to keep them on his side, and the blame seems to lay mostly with Descartes himself. (There were some exceptions, such as Henri Reneri [105] and Cornelis van Hogelande [307] who remained Descartes' friends for life.) The case of Isaac Beeckman provides an example of a once-dear friend who incurs Descartes' fury, in Beeckman's case, for sharing details of Descartes' Compendium of Music with Marin Mersenne (46-52). Of this rift, Clarke writes:

When one finds that Descartes disputed publicly with Fermat, Roberval, Voetius, Bourdin, and many others, the emotionally charged rift with Beeckman assumes the status of the first example of what subsequently emerged as a pattern in his personal and professional life. (52)

The case of Gassendi provides an example of a critic who incurs Descartes' fury due to the fact of his criticism. As a result of their "sharp" exchange, namely the Fifth Objections and Replies to the Meditations, Descartes punished Gassendi by refusing to allow him to see Descartes' replies to the objections and then printing the objections under Gassendi's name, in contrast with the other (anonymously published) objections (205). That occurred in the printing of the first edition of the Meditations. Later, and in response to Gassendi's critical A Metaphysical Disquisition: Or Doubts and Counter Objections to the Metaphysics of René Descartes, and his Replies, Descartes decided "to retaliate… by deleting the Fifth Objections from the next edition of the text… " (279). Descartes seems to have been in almost constant battle with one or another critic or erstwhile friend -- with Voetius (218-45), the Leiden theologians (chapter 12), French mathematicians (168-175), Regius (chapters 8 and 11), and the list goes on. Given this, and given the fact that Descartes himself is portrayed as the principal source of the disputes, the reader wonders if Descartes was completely disingenuous or rather self-deceived in his

self-serving description of his attitude to criticism. Not only is he 'docile' [according to his own claim], but he is reluctant to speak in his own defense… . He even claims not to care whether others have anticipated his discoveries, thereby implying that he would not get involved in priority disputes… . The reality was rather different. (158-59; see also 197)

Perhaps the least attractive of his many failings was Descartes' duplicity, on show repeatedly throughout the book. As one example, we see him sending pairs of letters to Queen Christina and to Chanut presenting sharply divergent attitudes toward the Queen's invitation to Sweden. "These parallel letters… ", writes Clarke, "show Descartes at his dissembling best" (384).

While Descartes is portrayed with many flaws and few positive personality traits, the reader gains insight into one reason why Descartes might have been so. He lived under an almost constant threat from various religious authorities, a threat that continuously undermined his ability to write and publish freely, especially on scientific matters. One of the prime virtues of Clarke's book is the extensive context he provides so as to make sense of Descartes' thought. This includes the political and social context, for example, the organization of French society in Descartes' youth (10ff), details on the printing of books in the seventeenth century (137ff), and the political atmosphere in Paris during Descartes' final trip to France (370ff). Of central importance to understanding Descartes, however, is the religious and scientific context that Clarke provides.

Descartes inherited from Copernicus and Galileo the intellectual conflicts involved in attempting to develop the new astronomy and, at the same time, to remain within the Catholic Church. He avoided church censure of his astronomy for almost two decades by dissimulation, self-censorship, and astuteness. However, his ambiguous support for Copernicus was merely a symptom of a much more radical problem that could not be camouflaged as easily. Descartes challenged the fundamental philosophy in terms of which both Catholic and Reformed theologians had expressed their teaching of Christian dogmas for centuries. That could not be marginalized as a technical question in astronomy that only experts might be expected to understand (4).

This background helps the reader understand both Descartes' personality and, to an extent, his hectic movements. Many of Descartes' "battles", in which his cantankerous personality is on display, were centered around potential theological clashes and his attempts to avoid them. Moreover, Descartes undertook at least some of his travels -- for example, his 1619 trip to Germany (52-54) -- in order to find a more open-minded intellectual atmosphere. So it is this third theme -- the religious threats that hovered over Descartes due to his innovations in natural philosophy -- which emerges as fundamental in understanding much about Descartes' life. This may not be news to the Descartes scholar, but Clarke's biography gathers together an extraordinary degree of detail on the theological pressures that Descartes faced, underscoring the shaping force that they had upon Descartes' thought and life. This theme also helps to explain to the non-expert Descartes' towering position in the history of philosophy due to his being at the forefront of the philosophical revolution that was bound up with the scientific revolution of the seventeenth century -- revolutions that forever changed the relations among science, theology, and philosophy.

In addition to these three central themes, Clarke provides extremely clear and crisp expositions of the philosophy found in Descartes' major works -- and also some less well-known pieces such as the essay on love written in response to questions posed by Chanut (338-41). While these are useful reminders for Descartes scholars, the non-expert will find these pages particularly helpful for gaining an insight into Descartes' contributions to the history of philosophy. These sections include an admirably accessible treatment of the scientific essays accompanying the Discourse on Method -- the Dioptrics, Meteors, and Geometry -- works which have been too rarely read alongside the more popular Discourse (144-52). The excellent treatment of the many themes of the Elizabeth correspondence is also worthy of note (254-76). In addition to this exposition, the reader gains a clear view of the general arc and development of Descartes' thought. Broadly, his early interests included mathematics, physics, and astronomy; he undertook a major shift in focus around 1640 when he returned in earnest to metaphysical problems (184); and his interests in physiology and human passions tended to occupy him in his later years. In addition, the non-expert will get a good sense of the fluidity of intellectual boundaries (between metaphysics, natural philosophy or science, theology and so forth) in the seventeenth century, essential for understanding the philosophy of that time. The book is also peppered with wonderful details such as the opportunity Descartes had in the unusually cold winter of 1634-35 to study closely the shapes of snowflakes (130).

Clarke's biography is exhaustively researched and documented. Where details of Descartes' life are sketchy and uncertain, Clarke has done a fair bit of sleuthing around for whatever information is available, and then suggests plausible reconstructions given the limited material. A casual reader of seventeenth-century philosophy or intellectual history who wishes to gain a very general understanding of Descartes' importance may find the book too detailed, but for such a reader, it should be easy enough to focus on passages of interest, skimming over the rest. For the scholar, much of what Clarke writes about Descartes' life, work, and thought was known already, but much is also enriched and expanded, and the scholar will find it an invaluable resource on Descartes' life given the meticulous detail gathered together in one place.

[1] Stephen Gaukroger, Descartes: an intellectual biography, Oxford University Press, 1995; Geneviève Rodis-Lewis, Descartes: Biographie, Calmann-Lévy, 1995 (released in English as Descartes; His Life and Times, translated by Jane Marie Todd, Cornell University Press, 1998); and Richard Watson, Cogito Ergo Sum: the Life of René Descartes, David R. Godine, 2002.