Descartes: Belief, Scepticism and Virtue

Placeholder book cover

Davies, Richard, Descartes: Belief, Scepticism and Virtue, Routledge, 2001, 382 pp, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-415-25122-2.

Reviewed by John Marshall, University of Virginia


Davies describes his approach to Descartes as novel, referring specifically to its virtue-theoretic framework, but we get a hint of broader heterodoxy in the opening sentence. “The account of Descartes’ thought presented in this essay is an effort to answer the question: “why should anyone bother with the sort of enquiry that Descartes describes?” (1) For isn’t it odd, he asks, that a man who so influenced the history of modern philosophy as to have been dubbed its father conducted his search for truth in a manner emulated by no one else? Davies’ book-long answer comes to this: the persona who so influenced history was not the real Descartes and this because the real Descartes’ mode of enquiry and conception of knowledge were in fact rejected as (to use Frankfurt’s phrase) lunatic a priorism. Accordingly, Davies writes in the final sentence of the book that Descartes is interesting to us “because he is not the father of modern philosophy.” (292) Framed by these sentences is a book containing much erudite commentary and not a little novelty. I have already mentioned the virtue-theoretic mold in which Davies casts his interpretation. A bit unusual also are some omissions. Noting that he has nothing new to add to extant accounts of the cogito, arguments for the existence of God, dualism and the validation of reason, he sets these topics aside. On other topics, however, he does have new things to say. He argues that in establishing the existence of a veracious God Descartes does not thereby refute the demon hypothesis, that even with a veracious God the response to the dreaming argument in Meditation VI is a failure, that, therefore, there is no respectable epistemic bridge to the external world and that the hypothetico-deductive method of science is not a route to knowledge.

I turn now to an outline of the book, beginning with the framework, of which Davies writes: “My central claim is that by applying virtue-theoretic insights we can do better for Descartes than many other ways of building on or replying to him.” (12) Highlighted by such insights is doxastic rectitude, the virtue between the vices of credulity (an excess) and of skepticism (a defect). The advertised advantage of this approach is that of virtue theory more generally, that it faithfully represents good self-governance not as a matter of applying rules but as a matter of having a certain character. “If it is a virtue, then rectitude or following the method is not a formula or an algorithm” (220) This interpretation, he thinks, is confirmed textually by the fact that Descartes abandoned the conception of method of the Rules in favor of the different conception of the Discourse and confirmed hermeneutically by the fact—or promise—that viewing Descartes as a virtuous enquirer helps us better to understand him.

Davies structures his book accordingly, devoting four chapters to the vice of credulity, two to the vice of skepticism and four to the virtue of doxastic rectitude. “Credulity,” he writes, “is the first doxastic disposition operative in humans.” (38) It is the deeply rooted disposition to depend on sense experience to discover what our world and we are like. The vice of childhood, although rarely outgrown even by sophisticated adults, credulity ranges from crude naïve realism to contemporary scientific realism (instrumentalism belonging to the vice of skepticism). Early on, according to Davies, and independently of the later skeptical arguments, Descartes came to doubt that sense-based belief could amount to knowledge. Nonetheless, the charm of empiricism lingered, at least until he found the needed prophylactic in skepticism.

Skepticism, in contrast to credulity, is the disposition not to accept as true what we can know is true. Though effective therapy, especially in the advanced forms of the dreaming and demon arguments, skepticism does not mark the end of enquiry. For manipulate our thinking as he will, the demon cannot bring it about that the innate, clear and distinct ideas we get directly from a veracious God are false. Still—a striking feature of Davies’ interpretation—the demon himself is not ruled out once God is ruled in. “There is no reason to suppose that Descartes would have seen any overall inconsistency between the existence of a veracious God and that of an agent bent on and powerful enough to deceive so weak and credulous a creature as the Meditation’s narrator.” (192) The agent in question would be the Devil, whose possibility Descartes as a good Catholic would have to concede. (192) In any case, the limits of skepticism define the domain of doxastic rectitude.

How, then, does one “enquire virtuously”? (201) Davies grants that in defense of his interpretation he has to make plausible “the idea that a method may be a procedure that can be rigidly applied without necessarily being fully expressible as a body of doctrine.” (201) To this end he gives a short commentary on Discourse II. The first rule, he says, is to guard against the vices of ‘rushing’ into judgment and of ‘conserving’ past judgments—these being familiar forms of credulity. On the positive side—the anticipated answer to skepticism—it enjoins us to restrict belief to what is evident. The other rules bring into view some new vices, however, since the enquirer might still bite off more than he can chew, muddle what is obvious with what is not or think that he has completed an intellectual operation that he cannot rehearse at will and “in a single sweep of thought.” (211)

The single positive demand of rectitude is rigorously to confine one’s assent exclusively to clear and distinct ideas. (225) This leaves as the only possible rudiments of knowledge such simple, non-derivative conceptions as those of existence, unity, duration, substance, order and number (224-25). From these the virtuous enquirer is to proceed by analysis to the first truths of metaphysics. (227) The epistemic advance from simple (and very abstract) notions to more detailed and specific knowledge is illustrated (but not exemplified) by analysis in mathematics. “[T]he first metaphysical principles stand to what is deduced from them as the definition of a geometrical figure stands to the various properties that can be dug out of it.” (245) Taking quite seriously Descartes’ tree analogy in the letter-preface to the Principles, Davies has the pure enquirer begin with the roots, metaphysics, and proceed by analysis to the trunk, physics, and then to the fruits, medicine, mechanics and morals, retracing through analysis a course laid out by God when he created eternal truths. (237) Though Davies concedes that this project may seem implausible, “it is certainly what Descartes argues for” (238) and a fixed feature of his thought from the Rules to the Principles. (247)

We know that doxastic rectitude permits no appeal to experience. Even belief based on a confirmed, empirically significant hypothesis fails to meet the standard of knowledge, however useful for prediction and control. Indeed, true knowledge through causes would be proof against any putative empirically based counterexample. (259) Why, then, was Descartes so keen to conduct experiments? The short answer is that experiment is a mere expedient, a useful guide to enquiry in its preliminary, reductive phase. Nonetheless, a “properly attuned enquirer would not seek in the deliverances of the senses, however well arranged and harnessed, support for the truths that she acquires in accordance with doxastic rectitude, namley those that she sees clearly and distinctly as consequences of the primary truths.” (267)

Within the life of a man or woman, however, even rectitude has its limits. For one can acquire knowledge by supernatural means, knowledge to which the pure enquirer as a person of faith must defer. (280) For example, the person of faith knows supernaturally that the creation of the world as described in Genesis is a unique event of its kind, that the world was created fully formed and ordered, and that the earth does not move. (290)

In the above outline I have not mentioned a number of topics Davies takes up. Especially interesting are his discussions of Cartesian skepticism and his commentary on Meditation IV. In the latter Davies shows how it is possible in order to serve a purpose other than enquiry that one voluntarily dissent from what is clear and distinct, say, in matters of church doctrine. I am obliged to say, however, that Davies’ virtue-theoretic interpretation does not deliver on its promise to “do better for Descartes than many other ways of building on or replying to him.” (12) I find, for example, in Daniel Garber’s far more orthodox treatment in, “Semel in Vita,” essentially the same Descartes, one deeply concerned with ridding himself of the temptation to rely on the senses, one wholly alive to the therapeutic uses of skepticism and one committed to pure intellection as the only source of genuine knowledge. Moreover, I find false the alleged contrast between a Descartes who is the embodiment of the virtue of doxastic rectitude and the more familiar Descartes who conducts enquiry according to certain rules of method. Even in the Rules Descartes’ rules are not algorithmic. And it does not take virtue theory to instruct us that rules require judgment in their application, a point Kant made later in the Groundwork when, speaking of moral rules, he said that for their application one needs judgment sharpened by experience. There is no more reason to depict Descartes as an epistemic virtue theorist than there is to depict Kant as a moral virtue theorist. As to the putative virtue of doxastic rectitude, Davies himself defines it in terms of the single rule to keep assent strictly to what is clear and distinct. That this rule requires judgment for its application is a point emphasized by Descartes and the reason he gives for spending so much time sharpening his power of judgment by practicing mathematics.

On the question of modern philosophy’s paternity, it must surely be conceded that without Descartes we would not have the Malebranche, the Spinoza, the Leibniz history gives us, nor its empiricist tradition. So what does Davies have in mind when he says that Descartes is not the father of modern philosophy? At least two thoughts. The first is that Descartes was so antecedently committed to belief in a veracious God as to be unwilling to explore the possibility of amputating the theory of knowledge from theology. (291-92) The other thought, which contradicts the first, is that strictly as a philosopher (putting his supernatural Catholicism aside), Descartes was an uncompromising a priorist who would not allow anything “that is both empirical and knowledge.” (292) I will not argue the first, highly contestable point here. As to the second, it is of course true that radical a priorism did not become the path of natural science nor that of contemporary metaphysics, though just what Davies’ himself thinks about a priorism is not clear from the book; he is willing to describe it as “weird” and remarks that it will not likely get us beyond metaphysics (246) yet he also says that it is coherent and responsive to legitimate demands on the theory of knowledge. (268) In any event, the only live issue concerning how modern or contemporary Descartes is can be decided only by how much the study of Descartes stimulated or now stimulates fruitful lines of philosophical enquiry. Here one can only let the record speak for itself.