Descartes' Deontological Turn: Reason, Will, and Virtue in the Later Writings

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Noa Naaman-Zauderer, Descartes' Deontological Turn: Reason, Will, and Virtue in the Later Writings, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 224pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521763301.

Reviewed by C. P. Ragland, Saint Louis University


Descartes' ethical views are typically seen as peripheral to his philosophical system, a kind of afterthought appended to his epistemology and metaphysics. In her excellent new book, Noa Naaman-Zauderer turns this conventional wisdom on its head. She spots an important theme in Descartes' ethical thinking -- his insistence that "nothing except virtue really deserves praise" (AT 5:84 / CSMK 325)[1] -- and uses it to offer a compelling new interpretation of Descartes' epistemological project in the Meditations. She points out that Descartes' conception of virtue (as the resolution to act on our best judgments) is deontological or non-consequentialist because it makes virtue depend only on the right use of free will, not on the outcomes of that use. As Descartes himself says, our sincere best effort "may be bad, but none the less we can be sure of having done our duty" (AT 5:84 / CSMK 325). Naaman-Zauderer contends that Descartes took a similar stance in epistemology: right use of will is the central aim, and we can be sure that we have made our best effort even if we can never be certain that our beliefs are true "absolutely speaking". She substantiates this contention through a careful analysis of Descartes' views on the truth and falsehood of ideas, on error in judgment, and on the natures of human freedom and virtue. For readers interested in getting new insights into Descartes' thought, I highly recommend this provocative and cogently argued book.

In the long first chapter, weighing in at fifty pages, Naaman-Zauderer wades into the scholarly disputes surrounding Descartes' theory of ideas, surveying current interpretative schools of thought and locating her own readings within them. Descartes uses the following adjectives to describe ideas: 'true' or 'false', 'clear' or 'obscure', 'distinct' or 'confused', and finally 'materially false'. Naaman-Zauderer takes a careful look at what Descartes meant by each of these labels.

In explaining truth and falsehood, she presents the two prevailing interpretations of how Cartesian ideas represent external objects. According to "representationalism," ideas are really distinct from the objects they represent, and we perceive external objects indirectly by encountering their representative ideas. According to "direct realism," "when we perceive an extra-mental thing, the immediate object of our perception is the thing itself and not … an entity mediating between the thing and the mind" (24-25)[2]; on this view, there is no real distinction between an idea (say, the idea of the sun) and its object (the sun itself). Naaman-Zauderer argues that Descartes is a representationalist according to whom "every idea … insofar as it represents a 'thing' is a true (corresponding) representation of that thing" (28). Truth as correspondence is thus "an essential component of representation" (6). False ideas have no objects -- they fail to represent anything, though we can take them to represent something and so be led astray (that is why Descartes says that false ideas represent "non-things as if they were things") (35).[3] Naaman-Zauderer claims that because for Descartes ideas cannot misrepresent their objects, he can avoid veil-of-ideas skepticism (at least about clear and distinct ideas).

Descartes is often taken to hold that ideas are clear and distinct (or obscure and confused) in virtue of their content. On this reading, an obscure idea is like a murky, unfocused photograph -- we cannot tell what it portrays no matter how carefully we look. Naaman-Zauderer proposes, by contrast, that clarity and distinctness or obscurity and confusion characterize "the mind's gaze rather than the object perceived" (45). Ideas in themselves are like sharply focused photos, but we grasp this only if we put on our glasses and move into the light. She proffers convincing evidence for her interpretation: Descartes says in the Second Meditation that his perception of the very same piece of wax can be either obscure and confused or clear and distinct, depending on how he approaches it (AT 7:31 / CSM 2:21). According to Naaman-Zauderer, clarity of perception increases as the mind attends to more and more of an idea's total content (38-39). Perception is distinct when the mind distinguishes the idea's content from that of all other ideas (42) and so does not misinterpret it as referring "to something other than that to which the idea corresponds" (44).

Descartes says that some sensory ideas, such as color or heat and cold, are "materially false," representing "non-things as things" (AT 7:43/ CSM 2:30). On the basis of this quote, many interpreters take materially false ideas to be ontologically false (non-referring). Naaman-Zauderer, however, offers an interesting argument that "material falsity is an epistemic category applying to ideas … whose inherent and irremediable obscurity and confusion do not enable us to tell whether they are ontologically true or false" (51).

Chapter two expounds many of the main themes of Descartes' Fourth Meditation and focuses on what he means by "error." Most interpreters assume, implicitly or explicitly, that for Descartes error is just having false beliefs (affirming falsehood or denying truth). But Naaman-Zauderer points to the following crucial remark by Descartes: "In … incorrect use of free will may be found the privation which constitutes the essence of error" (AT 7:60 / CSM 2:41). She then carefully explicates this passage in its context. Descartes believes in the following norm of assent (for theoretical matters): we should never pass judgment unless we perceive our subject clearly and distinctly. In the above text, he claims that error is essentially misuse of freedom to pass judgment in violation of this norm. Therefore, every instance of error has a positive and negative aspect. The positive aspect is the will's passing of judgment, and the negation is "the lack of some knowledge" or clear and distinct perception "which the agent should have possessed" in order to rightly pass judgment (77). On Naaman-Zauderer's reading, even true beliefs formed in violation of the norm count as erroneous in the Cartesian sense. As she says, "any violation of this rational duty constitutes an instance of error, irrespective of its ensuing results" (3). Flouting the norm of assent is bad in itself (and blameworthy) even if it results in true belief. The value of rationality (of obeying the norm) is independent of the value of truth.

Naaman-Zauderer develops this last idea into an impressive new understanding of Descartes' epistemological project. Reflection on the problem of the Cartesian Circle has convinced many commentators that if Descartes aims at truth, his project must fail. And so they have latched on to the following (puzzling and intriguing) passage from the Second Replies:

What is it to us that someone may make out that the perception whose truth we are so firmly convinced of may appear false to God or an angel, so that it is, absolutely speaking, false? Why should this alleged "absolute falsity" bother us … ? (AT 7:145 / CSM 2:103)

Frankfurt[4] and others have taken this passage to show that Descartes aims not at truth, but merely at subjective certainty. However, as Naaman-Zauderer notes, there is considerable evidence that Descartes was on a search for truth, not just certainty (96). How, then, are we to understand the passage above? She suggests that for Descartes the epistemic goal is not so much to get true beliefs as it is to try our best to get true beliefs. Therefore, "even if it were true that our most certain perceptions might be absolutely false, we would not be … misusing our free will by assenting to them" (98). Because rationality (right use of the will) is a good in its own right, a fully rational agent has achieved something worthwhile even if the universe has conspired to cut her off from absolute truth. If Naaman-Zauderer is right, then in the above passage Descartes is saying about epistemology what Kant later so famously said about ethics:

Even if, by a special disfavor of fortune or by the niggardly provision of a stepmotherly nature, [the good will] should wholly lack the capacity to carry out its purpose -- if with its greatest efforts it should yet achieve nothing and only the good will were left … then, like a jewel, it would still shine by itself, as something that has its full worth in itself.[5]

Chapter three addresses the notion of free will at work in Descartes' account of error. Scholars agree that Descartes considers spontaneity essential to the will and freedom, but have long been divided over his position on two-way power (the ability to do or not do something). Descartes' remarks on two-way power are confusing, sometimes suggesting that two-way power is essential to freedom and sometimes that it is not. Naaman-Zauderer argues that for Descartes the will enjoys two-way power with respect to obscure ideas (it can assent to them or not) but not with respect to clear and distinct ideas (it can only assent to them). Because clear and distinct ideas determine the will without removing its freedom (indeed, the will is most free when thus determined), two-way power cannot be essential to the will. However, she suggests that two-way power is still "essential to our freedom in an indirect sense" (125) because we cannot achieve clear perception without exercising two-way power to direct and concentrate our attention on the genuine content of our ideas (here her discussion connects nicely to her account of representation in chapter one). This is a topic on which I myself have published extensively, and though I do not agree with certain aspects of her reading, I consider her treatment of the relevant texts thorough and important -- it introduces some genuinely new and interesting ideas into the debates about the details of Descartes' view.

Chapter four explores Descartes' claim that human freedom is similar to God's. For Descartes, the human will is essentially posterior to the intellect, but (due to divine simplicity) the divine intellect and will are "one and the same, neither one prior to the other" (132). How, then, can Descartes claim that "it is above all in virtue of the will that I understand myself to bear in some way the image and likeness of God" (AT 7:57 / CSM 2:40)? Naaman-Zauderer argues that neither the human will's spontaneity nor its two-way power can serve to make it similar to God's will. She then suggests that Descartes did not mean to say so much that our will is similar to God's, as that we can experience it as similar to God's: in our freest moments, when clear perceptions determine the will -- when the intellect's reasons and the will's inclinations speak with the same voice -- we "experience [the will] as unified with our intellect" (8), just as God's will and intellect are one. This inner experience of freedom, she claims, suffices to make us morally responsible. Even if from an external or divine perspective our actions depend on God and are determined by divine providence, we remain accountable to our own, internal standards (as in the case of "absolute truth" in chapter two) (140).

In the final two chapters, Naaman-Zauderer turns to Descartes' ethical views proper. In chapter five, she focuses on two places in which Descartes took "initial steps toward developing his mature conception of practical reason" (149): his remarks concerning faith and his provisory morality in the Discourse on the Method. Concerning faith, Descartes says that though revealed doctrines are sometimes obscure in themselves, the light of grace can assure us that they are revealed by God and so ought to be believed; if, without grace, we assent to these same doctrines on the basis of fallacious arguments, we sin (see AT 7:148 / CSM 2:106). Once again, Descartes is primarily concerned not with the content or consequences of belief, but rather with adhering to rational standards. Descartes' provisory morality "culminates in the two key objectives of Descartes' ethics" (177): virtue and happiness. In Chapter six, Naaman-Zauderer focuses on the relation between virtue and happiness in Descartes' "more developed ethical writings" from 1645-49 (179). She argues that, though Descartes thinks virtue always produces happiness, he "considers virtue not merely a means to happiness but rather our supreme good" (179). So he is a kind of virtue ethicist, but he construes virtue in deontological terms as doing our duty to "use our reason as best we can and act resolutely according to our best judgment" (9).

Some of Naaman-Zauderer's claims did not convince me. Here I will mention three of my concerns. First, I suspect she may overstate the extent to which virtue rather than happiness is the ultimate end of our actions for Descartes. Descartes says that "the supreme good of each individual … consists only in a firm will to do well and the contentment which this produces" (AT 5:82 / CSMK 324, my emphasis), and that "the end of our actions" can be understood to be either virtue or happiness (AT 4:275 / CSMK 261). I think Naaman-Zauderer should have considered more carefully the possibility that Descartes was a eudaimonist, for whom virtue is a necessary part of our total happiness. Second, I was not convinced by her relatively quick argument that Descartes' theory of reference inoculates him against veil-of-ideas skepticism. If ideas are really distinct (in the Cartesian sense) from the things they represent, then it is metaphysically possible for even a clearly perceived idea to fail to refer (i.e., to exist without its putative object). This opens up skeptical possibilities that Naaman-Zauderer does not explore. It may be that this is just the sort of "absolute falsity" that she takes Descartes not to worry about, but she does not say this explicitly. Third, I found her treatment of the similarity between divine and human freedom rather strained. Her suggestion that we sometimes experience our intellect and will as unified, though ingenious and intriguing, lacks any sort of direct textual support. Furthermore, the subjective sense of similarity it posits is not enough to meet Descartes' theological goals in the Fourth Meditation, where he is concerned to show that the human will is perfect in its kind because of a real, objective similarity between it and the divine will. Finally, in my view she does not make an adequate case against the possibility that two-way power in both God's will and ours provides the relevant objective point of similarity.

Despite these reservations, I want to be clear that my overall evaluation is enthusiastically positive: this book is a very significant contribution to Cartesian studies -- a "must read," in my opinion, for faculty or graduate students interested in the topics it addresses (because it is quite densely written, it is probably not appropriate for most undergraduates). It exhibits a tight thematic unity despite dealing with a number of different issues. In this review, I've concentrated on this unity, but the individual chapters contain many more interesting details and so are worth reading as stand-alone explorations of their specific topics. They are impeccably researched and cogently argued, fully engaging both the primary texts and the relevant secondary literature. According to Naaman-Zauderer, her goal in the book is "to open up a new way of approaching a wide cluster of long-debated issues in Descartes' epistemology and ethics" (6). She not only makes a brilliant effort toward this goal, but achieves it.

[1] References to Descartes use the following abbreviations:

AT: Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, eds., Oeuvres de Descartes, 2nd ed., 11 vols. (Paris: Vrin/C.N.R.S., 1974-86).

CSM: John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, and Dugald Murdoch, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Vol. 1 and 2 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985).

CSMK: Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, and Anthony Kenny, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Vol. 3 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).

[2] Parenthetical references are to the work being reviewed.

[3] See AT 7:43 / CSM 2:30.

[4] See Harry Frankfurt, "Descartes on the Consistency of Reason," in Descartes: Critical and Interpretive Essays, ed. Michael K. Hooker (Baltimore MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1978), 37-38.

[5] Immanuel Kant and Mary J. Gregor, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals (Cambridge University Press, 1998), 8. For the original see Kants Schriften, Akademie Ausgabe (Berlin: W. deGruyter, 1902-) vol. 4, p. 394.