Descartes' Meditations: A Critical Guide

Placeholder book cover

Karen Detlefsen (ed.), Descartes' Meditations: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 264pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521111607.

Reviewed by Michael Della Rocca, Yale University


What explains the continuing power the Meditations has over us, its ability to shape our ways of philosophical thinking even today? As influential as Descartes' arguments have been, it is certainly not the rational compellingness of those arguments that gives the book its exalted place in philosophy. And while Descartes' departures from Aristotelian philosophy (to the extent that he broke with it) are historically and philosophically important, they do little to explain the lasting and powerful attraction of the Meditations. I will return to this mysterious power at the end of this review. But first I want to show how the many fine and well-selected essays in Karen Detlefsen's volume collectively confirm the widespread conviction that engagement with Descartes remains vital to philosophy.

The first of the essays, by Thomas Lennon and Michael Hickson, concerns Descartes' doubt in the Meditations and, in particular, the ways in which all certainty -- even of the cogito -- depends on the certainty of the existence of God. This paper points the way to what may be a key to understanding the hold the Meditations has on us, as we'll see at the end of this review.

Deborah Brown goes even more deeply into the nature of Cartesian skepticism by suggesting that even though there are important affinities between Descartes' skepticism and ancient skepticism, Descartes' skepticism is, in one way at least, more radical because it extends to the very content of our ideas.

Daniel Garber offers a rich account of the ways in which Descartes' encounter with Hobbes' materialist objections to the cogito argument led Descartes to a "new doctrine of substance" (p. 58) that, unlike his previous theory, did not invite the Hobbesian objection. On Garber's interpretation, Descartes' early view is that a substance is a subject of inherence and that the properties of substance -- including thought and extension -- are "accidents" of a substance (pp. 52, 58). But this view leaves Descartes open to the Hobbesian objection. If substance is a mere subject with accidents like thought and extension, then Hobbes is right: we cannot rule out the possibility that the underlying nature of substance allows for thought and extension to exist in the same substance.

In the face of this challenge, Descartes needs, according to Garber, to reconceive what it is to be a substance, and that's precisely what Descartes does. After the Third Replies -- Descartes' response to Hobbes -- and in the Principles, which Descartes was working on around the same time, Descartes comes to see substance not as involving a bare subject, but rather simply as an independent thing with its character as thinking or as extended built into its nature.

Seeing Descartes' views on substance in light of Descartes' encounter with Hobbes is illuminating. However, I would like to raise two worries about the neatness of Garber's account. First, it is, I think, not right to say that Descartes announces a new doctrine of substance after Hobbes' criticism. The independence criterion of substance -- which is central to Descartes' account in his response to Arnauld and in the Principles -- had already been invoked in the Meditations (as Garber notes, pp. 49, 61-62) before the exchange with Hobbes. Second, it is crucial to Garber's account of Hobbes' objection that Descartes held initially that a substance is a bare subject to which thought and extension are added as accidents. But a problem here is that Descartes does not seem even in the earlier texts to regard thought and extension as mere accidents. Although Descartes does in the reply to Hobbes distinguish the substance as subject and its essence, he does not indicate that this essence is merely an accident. Indeed, traditionally an essence would be seen as not merely an accident, and Descartes gives no sign of departing from the tradition on this point.

Martha Bolton's rich essay carefully explores the character of Descartes' view that thought is the nature of certain substances, and she shows how thinking is a faculty for having thoughts but is not by itself sufficient for the existence of particular thoughts. One theme here, which I will return to in the context of Lisa Shapiro's essay, is that Descartes may not offer a formal account of the "metaphysical arrangements" in virtue of which Descartes' general claims about substance and the substance/accident relation are true (p. 75); in other words, Descartes may not tell us how a substance operates.

Tad Schmaltz advances our understanding of Descartes in three main ways: he clarifies the background in scholastic philosophy of Descartes' causal principles; he provides powerful considerations against a so-called cinematic view of creation as a series of distinct acts of creation; and he offers a plausible reading of how Descartes came to clarify the sense in which God is and is not the cause of God's existence. On this last question the short answer is that God is not the efficient cause of his existence, but God's essence is a formal cause of God's existence.

Lilli Alanen -- in a spirit similar to Schmaltz's -- articulates the scholastic background for some of Descartes' problematic claims concerning freedom. Along the way, she clarifies the kinds of two-way power and indifference that Descartes appeals to, and the different ways Descartes treats cognitive and practical goods.

John Carriero does a characteristically meticulous job of showing how, although Descartes breaks with Aristotelian views, he is more beholden to Aristotelian ways of thinking than might be apparent to us today. Carriero's target is Descartes' alleged indirect realism according to which our senses do not enable us to perceive physical objects directly; instead, we perceive our ideas themselves directly. Such indirect realism is often seen as a major break from Aristotelian accounts of perception, which rely upon an identity of form in -- and thus upon resemblance between -- perceiver and perceived.

This contrast between Descartes' view and Aristotelianism may be pleasingly sharp, but as Carriero shows, it is nowhere to be found in Descartes' texts. For Carriero, the philosophical work that the sharing of forms does for the Aristotelian is performed in Descartes by the thesis that perceiver and perceived share the same reality. Carriero describes this shared reality as shared structure. However, it's difficult to see what this shared structure could be for Descartes. As Carriero points out, for Descartes, in a physical object such as a red card, there is "only a microphysical texture, a pattern of matter in motion" (p. 118). Carriero goes on to say that "when I have an idea of red, I am not made formally identical with the microphysical texture" (p. 118). But if microphysical texture is all that there is in the object, and if such texture is not in the perceiver, then exactly what, for Carriero's Descartes, is the same, what is shared between perceiver and perceived? Carriero says that there is shared structure, but it's not clear what this structure could amount to if not shared form.

Despite Descartes' inability -- rightly stressed by Carriero -- to break completely with Aristotelian accounts of perception, it may be that Descartes also tends toward a radically resemblance-free account of perception in which perceiver and perceived do not share anything, not even structure (whatever that may be), but instead the perceiver's state merely signifies (instead of resembles) the perceived object. Dennis Des Chene suggests such a position in a response to Carriero, which Carriero generously quotes (p. 116n18).

Gary Hatfield, as well as Carriero, reads Descartes as not wholly breaking with a resemblance account of perception. For Hatfield, this resemblance relation is "a relation [of color qualia] to the (micro) corporeal basis of color -- even though we can't know the latter fact merely by contemplating our sensory ideas of color, because they represent the micro-property obscurely" (p. 134). But here again the question arises: why should this relation be a kind of resemblance? What is there in bodies for an idea of red to resemble in however obscure a fashion? The fact that Carriero and Hatfield each struggle in different and equally subtle ways to articulate what this resemblance might be for Descartes may be reflective more of a difficulty for Descartes than of a problem with their interpretations. And it is worth noting that Hatfield in the end, perhaps even more than Carriero, leaves the door open to some kind of sign theory of representation in Descartes.

Descartes famously rejects teleological explanations -- at least when it comes to physics -- and, for him, things in general do not have end-directed natures. Of course, as Karen Detlefsen claims in her outstanding paper, artifacts and even many living things have ends imposed on them by something external to them, such as God or some lesser creator. But these things do not by nature act for the sake of an end, according to Descartes. By contrast, for Descartes, the human being -- the composite of the human mind and the human body -- does have an intrinsic end-directed nature. Detlefsen asks a deep and generally neglected question: what is it in virtue of which this composite has this teleological nature and has it, as it were, intrinsically. One suggestion is that the mind itself constructs such ends or imposes them on the body and thus on the composite. Detlefsen rightly denies that such Kantian shenanigans capture Descartes' thought. The only alternative may seem to be to deny that there is any intrinsicially end-directed activity even in human beings. But Detlefsen does not take this eliminativist line. Instead, she boldly claims that the ends of the human being are generated by the mind's recognition of value in the human body. Detlefsen is able to find surprising textual support (though not in the Meditations) for this reading, and she is able to say that the value the soul recognizes in the body is found by the soul at the level of the physical disposition of parts (such as hands, eyes, etc.) and not at the perhaps more fundamental level of the metaphysics of matter.

In thus seeing Descartes as drawing a distinction between physical, end-directed nature and metaphysical, teleology-free nature, Detlefsen offers us a Descartes who can consistently fulminate against teleology in objects considered at the metaphysical level while also embracing it in connection with the same objects considered at the level of physical disposition of parts. This is an extremely promising reading, but I have a question. What is the status of these physical (non-metaphysical) natures? Is Descartes justified in seeing such natures as genuine aspects of reality, or does the apparently more fundamental metaphysical level and its purely metaphysical, mechanistic explanations prevent such physical natures from having any genuine role to play? This is a version of the well-known worry about the potential for mechanism to exclude purpose, and one of Detlefsen's virtues is that she shows us in a new way precisely how this important question arises in and for Descartes.

Like Detlefsen, Lisa Shapiro makes important progress in understanding Descartes' attitude toward the metaphysics of the human being by asking an underappreciated in-virtue-of question. Shapiro's topic is the nature of the self, for Descartes, and, in particular the nature of the unity that the self enjoys. As Shapiro argues, it might seem natural to see a Cartesian self as unified because the self consists of a substance that is the bearer of the various modes or particular mental states that make up the life of a human being. According to this view -- not endorsed by Shapiro -- in response to "the question of whether these thoughts belong to the same self," "The answer seems to be that it is indeed that same self that has had all these thoughts because the thoughts are all modes of one and the same substance" (p. 229). Shapiro points out that this answer is inadequate. One way to express this worry is to point out that it leaves the key question unaddressed, for it is still not clear how the one substance can have or unify all these states.

Shapiro then turns elsewhere to answer her in-virtue-of question, and she finds illumination by turning to the overlooked role of memory in constituting the Cartesian self. With substantial textual evidence, Shapiro shows that for Descartes "Memory unifies the meditator's thoughts by effecting a continuity of the awareness of those thoughts. And in providing this unity, memory further helps make the meditator the thinking thing -- that is, the self -- she is" (p. 236). This focus on memory's role in the nature of the self brings Descartes unexpectedly close to Locke's view on the self, and it suggests a promising line for further research. However, one might worry whether, in the end, this memory-based conception of the self is any better than the substance-mode conception of the self in answering the key in-virtue-of question. For, just as one might ask how a mental substance unifies all these experiences, so too one might ask how memory constitutes the self. The meditator by its memory appropriates certain experiences and makes them its own. Okay, but how does the meditator appropriate the experiences? In virtue of what does the meditator make them its own? Descartes' wonderfully suggestive proto-Lockean account (as offered by Shapiro) may still leave the fundamental explanatory question unanswered.

To return to the initial question of this review, I note that the paper that most directly sheds light on why Descartes' Meditations continues to exert such power over us is Jorge Secada's. Recall that, as I suggested, Descartes' arguments are, on the whole, not especially compelling. And it is because philosophers and historians of philosophy nonetheless tend to dwell on arguments and conclusions that they may miss what is at work behind Descartes' grip on us. Secada begins by noticing -- correctly -- that the focus of philosophers "on argument and doctrine makes it difficult for them to keep the meditative character of this work in mind, or to apprehend securely its full consequence" (p. 201). As Secada goes on to comment in a striking turn of phrase, "the intended reader and the meditating ego are living through the same transformative process: the Meditations is its expression and it is supposed to be sung by both in unison" (p. 202).

Because the work is meditative, it offers us "an understanding that is not the finalized result of argument but an unending activity indistinguishable from meditation itself" (p. 204). The Meditations is meant to achieve this result by engaging the reader in a meditation on and a vision of God. (In highlighting the role of the meditator's knowledge of God, Secada returns to a theme stressed by Lennon and Hickson.) In its emphasis on the activity of meditation rather than on argument and doctrine, the Meditations, according to Secada, "embodies a conception of philosophy that is deeply anti-scholastic and anti-analytic" (p. 203). Secada thus provocatively separates Descartes not only from his scholastic predecessors but also from his descendants in analytical philosophy.

Perhaps, then, in looking for the source of Descartes' power over us, we might be well advised not only to dig deeper and deeper into his arguments and conclusions, but also, and perhaps more importantly, to appreciate the way in which Descartes' method takes us away from arguments and lifts us up to the contemplation of the highest reality. It is one of the merits of this well-rounded collection that it offers both kinds of perspective on the Meditations.