Descartes on Causation

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Tad M. Schmaltz, Descartes on Causation, Oxford University Press, 2008, 237pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195327946.

Reviewed by John Carriero, University of California, Los Angeles


In Descartes on Causation, Tad Schmaltz draws on medieval philosophical theology and the problem of the efficacy of secondary causes to argue for Descartes's distance from occasionalism. According to Schmaltz,[1] medieval theologians considered three main positions on the relation of secondary causes to the primary cause (i.e., God). Some, mainly in the Islamic tradition, held that secondary causes had no efficacy, and that all causal efficacy belonged to God. Others -- and this was by far the most common view -- thought that secondary causes required God's cooperation in order to be effective; since, on some elaborations of this view, God needed to supply his "concursus" in order for a secondary cause to cause something, this view is sometimes known as concurrentism. A third position -- associated primarily with Durandus of Saint-Pourçain -- was that secondary causes did not require God's assistance in order to operate; God merely created the causes and conserved them in existence, and they did the rest. Although Descartes is often read as an occasionalist, Schmaltz, strikingly, argues that he is a mere conservationist:

the deviant account of causation that I attribute to Descartes is not occasionalism; in fact, the view I have in mind is, in the context of the medieval scholastic debate over causality, the antipode of occasionalism, namely, the view that creatures rather than God are the real causes of natural change. This "mere conservationism" -- so called because God's role in natural causation is limited to the creation and conservation of the world -- was simply too radical for most scholastics. (p. 6)

The book has five chapters. In Chapter 1, Schmaltz summarizes the relevant background, especially in Suárez, required to develop his interpretation. In Chapter 2, he takes up two more general features of Descartes's thinking about causation, his commitment to the idea that a cause must contain eminently or formally its effect and his commitment to the view that God conserves the universe at each moment of its existence. With respect to the former, Schmaltz discusses a difficulty about how Descartes understands the notion of eminent containment, offering his interpretation of that difficult notion. With respect to the latter, Schmaltz argues that Descartes's views on the divine conservation of the universe do not of themselves indicate an occasionalist strand in his thought. (This strikes me as correct. What Descartes holds about God's conservation of the universe does not look very different from what Suárez and Aquinas hold, and they are not occasionalists; so those commitments do not provide evidence of occasionalism.) In Chapter 3, Schmaltz takes up body-body causation, examining the role of God and the laws of motion in the movement of bodies, and criticizing occasionalist interpretations of Descartes's physics. In Chapter 4, Schmaltz argues against the "Natural Institution" account of mind-body union, developed by Margaret Wilson, in favor of an interpretation that makes the union the basis of mind-body interaction, considers the problems raised for body's action on the mind in the light of body's having a lower ontological status than the mind, and considers various issues raised by the mind's action on body, including how to square such action with the conservation laws. In Chapter 5, Schmaltz considers the human will and freedom, appealing to Descartes's doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths in order to provide a novel account of how God foreknows what we are going to do without determining our wills.

How strong is the case that Schmaltz makes for the mere conservationist reading? Well, as Schmaltz points out, Descartes often uses the word concursus where his scholastic contemporaries would have expected conservatio (to the chagrin of Revius, pp. 100-101). But that of itself does not tell us very much (I do not know that Schmaltz would disagree). In particular, it does not make clear whether Descartes is now limiting concursus to what had been previously included in conservatio (so that the operations of secondary causes don't get a concursus distinct from their being conserved), or whether he is expanding the notion conservatio so that it now includes what was previously covered by concursus, or whether he is working with an undifferentiated, disjunctive notion of conservatio/concursus. Schmaltz argues, however, that further reflection on the relevant texts shows that Descartes is indeed limiting concursus to conservatio, so that God's contribution to a secondary cause's operation is simply to create and conserve that cause.

One of the more important texts here is Principles, II, 36 (cited on p. 91), where Descartes writes:

After this consideration of the nature of motion, we must look at its cause. This is in fact twofold: first, there is the universal and primary cause -- the general cause of all the motions in the world; and second there is the particular cause which produces in an individual piece of matter some motion which it previously lacked. Now as far as the general cause is concerned, it seems clear to me that this is nothing other than God himself, who in the beginning created matter at the same time with motion and rest [cum motu et quiete], and now, by his ordinary concursus [concursum ordinarium] alone, conserves the total quantity of motion and rest [motus et quietis … tota quantum] as he placed in it then.[2]

Descartes does not indicate in this extract that God's ordinary concursus is limited to his conservation of the total quantity of motion and rest. All he says is that the conservation of motion falls under God's ordinary concursus, so that a motion's continuing indefinitely is not miraculous. And it is not surprising that Descartes would want to make this point, because some of his scholastic contemporaries would have found a sublunar motion's continuing indefinitely miraculous, requiring God's extraordinary concursus. Schmaltz allows that this is one of the points that Descartes is making (p. 99), but thinks that much more is going on (§3.1.3). He bases this on an argument that Descartes gives later in the same article, when he writes that the conservation of motion follows from God's perfection, because that "perfection involves not only his being immutable in himself, but also his operating in a manner that is always utterly constant and immutable" (see also Principles, II, 42). Schmaltz infers from this that, for Descartes, God's ordinary concursus must have a "constant effect," such as the conservation of the quantity of motion. But if God's concursus must have a "constant effect," then God's concursus cannot reach (immediately) the particular causal transactions between bodies, because those transactions vary over time:

If my reading of Descartes is correct, then there can be in his physics no difference between God's ordinary concursus and his continuous conservation of matter in motion. Since this continuing action must have a constant effect, the changes in motion produced by bodily collisions must be due not to that action, but rather -- as Descartes himself indicates -- to the particular and secondary causes of motion. We are far here from the concurrentist position in Suárez that the diverse actions that produce such changes are identical to God's action. Instead, Descartes seems to me to be closer to the mere conservationism of Suárez's opponent Durandus. Recall that in Durandus's view, though God is the immediate cause of the being of secondary causes, his only contribution to the action of secondary causes is his conservation of such causes (see §1.1.3). In Descartes's case, the view is that God's ordinary concursus is exhausted by his continuous conservation of matter with the forces of its parts and inclinations of its motions. These forces and inclinations, rather than the divine concursus itself, are the immediate causes of changes due to collisions among these parts. (p. 126)

I found the overall position that Schmaltz attributes to Descartes puzzling. Descartes's only basis for the claim that God's concursus has a "constant effect" is divine immutability. But Descartes (along with his predecessors) must find some way of reconciling God's immutability with the fact that God's causation is involved in a created world that changes. (Schmaltz sketches how Suárez squares his concurrentism with divine immutability on p. 125.) Even at the level of conservation, there is variation in what God conserves. Consider, for example, a bowling ball initially at rest that is taken off a rack and rolled down the lane. While on the rack it has (let's suppose) no motive tendency; it picks up a motive tendency, MT1, from my hand and the lane, and then acquires another motive tendency, MT2, when it hits the pins. God must, then, conserve three different things over time, first the bowling ball without a motive tendency, then the bowling ball with the mode MT1, then the bowling ball with the mode MT2. Or take the case of a mind. As I compose this review, God conserves many different thoughts (modes) in my mind. And Descartes holds that God conserves without the intervention of any secondary cause (AT 7:111). So, I take it, Descartes must think that God's immutability is consistent with his immediate causal involvement in (at least) some kinds of variation in what he causes, that is, with at least some kinds of variation in the effect of that causation. If this is so, it is hard to see what is special about concursus. If God can immediately conserve a created world whose accidents (and arguably substances) vary over time, why can't God immediately lend his concursus to the varying operations of substances within that world?

When Schmaltz extends the conservationist picture from causation in physics to causation between the mind and the body, it seems to me that most of his discussion is devoted to arguing, in opposition to many other commentators, that Descartes thinks that mind and body have robust natures, robust enough that these natures can ground psycho-physical laws. I am sympathetic to Schmaltz's general outlook here. However, it is unclear to me that one can, as Schmaltz appears to try to do (p. 160), get from this point about the robustness of the natures of the mind and the body to the further claim that Descartes held a mere conservationist outlook on mind-body causation. The main text Schmaltz appeals to in this discussion comes from the conversation with Burman, where Descartes explains occasional sensory deception on the basis of God's constancy or uniformity (Descartes does something similar in the Sixth Meditation). Schmaltz concludes from this passage -- reasonably, it seems to me -- that "Divine constancy would seem to ensure that human souls and their bodies retain their same natures, and thus that they continue to follow the laws that those natures determine." But it is not clear to me why this suggests a mere conservationist picture as opposed to a concurrentist one. After all, some concurrentists held very robust conceptions of a thing's nature (e.g., Aquinas). Schmaltz's idea here may be that Descartes's discussion of bodies creates a sort of presumption in favor of a mere conservationist view in the mind-body context, so that if we can show that there are robust relevant natures for God to conserve, then we'll have good grounds for thinking that Descartes holds a mere conservationist view of their interaction as well. If so, then while Schmaltz provides some reason to opt for a concurrentist or mere conservationist as against an occasionalist reading of Descartes on mind-body causation, he provides no independent support for opting for a mere conservationist as against a concurrentist one in this realm.

What about mere conservationism and the will? On this topic, Schmaltz writes that in addition to establishing certain background conditions for free actions, "there is nothing that God needs to do produce the free actions beyond creating and conserving a world in which agents with the relevant inclinations exist in the appropriate circumstances" (p. 215); and "that God creates and conserves our will with inclinations" is enough, along with the background conditions, to "allow God to know with certainty how we would act in certain circumstances" (p. 216). Schmaltz's primary reason for his extension of his mere conservationist approach appears to be the success he thinks he's enjoyed thus far with the cases of body-body interaction and mind-body interaction (pp. 214-215).

But is that all that God does in the case of our free actions, namely create and conserve the will and its inclinations? Curiously, the one passage that most directly bears on this question seems to point in a concurrentist direction:

I must not complain that God concurs [concurrat] with me in choosing [ad eliciendos illos actus voluntatis, or sive illis judicia] those voluntary acts, or those judgments, in which I err; for these acts are all true and good, insofar as they depend on God, and it is in some manner more perfect that I could choose them, than if I could not. As for the privation involved, which is all that the formal nature of falsity and wrong consists in [ratio formalis falsitatis & culpae consistit], this does not in any way require the concursus of God, since it is not a thing; indeed, when it is referred to God as its cause, it should be called not a privation but simply a negation. (AT 7:60-61)[3]

According to Schmaltz's mere conservation approach, what God does when he concurs in my bad choices is simply to create and conserve me, with my will and its inclinations, leaving the rest of the causation up to me. But this seems to me to run against the grain of this text. What Descartes says God concurs with is the "choosing [eliciendos]," and choosing seems to go beyond merely being inclined. I'm not exactly sure where the "choosings" or the "acts" fit into Descartes's ontology, but it is hard to see what there remains for me to do on my own, post concurrence/conservation, once my choice or voluntary act has been secured. Further, the defense that Descartes gives against the "complaint" makes better sense in a concurrentist framework than in a conservationist one. That is, if Descartes were working within a conservationist framework, one would have expected him to have made the point that God is not immediately causally involved in my errors but only remotely involved, through creating and conserving me and my inclinations. However, Descartes does not deny God's immediate causal involvement in my bad choices. Rather, he says that the error or bad choice can be decomposed into two components, a "being" component (a "truth and good" component) and a "nonbeing" component. The "being" component, as a truth and good, requires God's concursus. The "nonbeing" component, "since it is not a thing," does not "in any way require the concursus of God." (Descartes goes on to indicate that the creature and creator are situated differently with respect to the "nonbeing" component -- they bear different responsibilities with respect to what's missing from the choice or act -- so that the "nonbeing" component counts as a "privation" with respect to me but only a "negation" with respect to God.) I find it very hard to hear this otherwise than as an explanation of why God's immediate cooperation with my will's bad choices does not implicate God in evil.

Interestingly, in the early work The World, Descartes connects the point we've just seen about the will to his physics in a surprising way:

it must be said that God alone is the author of all the motions in the world insofar as they are [sont] and insofar as they are rectilinear; but it is the various dispositions of matter which render them irregular and confused. Likewise, the theologians teach us that God is also the author of all our actions, in so far as they are [sont] and in so far as they have some goodness, but it is the various dispositions of our wills that can render them evil. (AT 11:46, CSM 1:97)

Notice to begin with that God is said to be the author of motions and actions, which gives this passage, too, a concurrentist flavor. There also seems to be a decomposition, like the one we have just seen, into "being" and "nonbeing." To the extent that a motion or action involves "being" (apparently, linearity in the case of motion and goodness in the case of action), it comes from God; to the extent that it involves "nonbeing" (apparently, irregularity and confusion in the case of motion and evil in the case of action), it does not require God; the irregularity of the movement of a particle or the evil in one of my actions can have a "cause" -- e.g., the "various dispositions" of matter or of our wills -- but this is a cause in the attenuated sense that nonbeings have causes. Obviously, the exact point that Descartes is making here is difficult and subtle, but I think this much is clear: he's not suggesting that there is anything on the "being" side of the ledger -- any perfection or goodness in a motion or action -- that does not require God's concursus.

I have focused on the question of whether Descartes was a mere conservationist because it appears to me to be the unifying thread to the book. Although I did not find the treatment of this topic persuasive, I do not want to leave the misimpression that this is all the book contains. There is much more, including, for example, a valuable discussion (building on the work of Guéroult and Gabbey) of the ontology of force, a helpful account (mentioned above) of the place of the nature of the mind, the body, and their union in mind-body causation, and a balanced and measured account of what Descartes says about freedom over the course of his career. The reader can profit from these discussions while remaining skeptical about the claim that Descartes was a mere conservationist.[4]

[1] Here I follow Schmaltz's account, along with Alfred J. Freddoso's "God's General Concurrence With Secondary Causes: Why Conservation Is Not Enough," Philosophical Perspectives 5 (1991): 553-85.

[2] I've given somewhat more of this passage than Schmaltz does on p. 91, using a combination of his translation and CSM.

[3] Schmaltz cites the first sentence on p. 214, and I've followed his translation. I've based the translation of the second sentence on CSM.

[4] I am grateful to Paul Hoffman for comments on an earlier draft of this review.