Descartes' Philosophical Revolution: A Reassessment

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Hanoch Ben-Yami, Descartes' Philosophical Revolution: A Reassessment, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 281pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137512017.

Reviewed by Dennis L. Sepper, University of Dallas


Hanoch Ben-Yami begins his first chapter with the assertion that Descartes revolutionized philosophy and immediately asks two questions: which of his ideas were revolutionary, and how did he arrive at them? His standard for "revolutionary ideas" requires that they

must be, first, new, and second, later adopted by most other philosophers; in addition, they should also have that vague quality of being revolutionary. Otherwise, there would not be this feeling of both a break with earlier traditions and an initiation of the Cartesian one, to which we belong (1).

Looking to the Meditations, he quickly dismisses scepticism (present already in Greek antiquity) and its refutation (a commonplace effort in the early seventeenth century), the dream argument (already in Plato), the deceiving god/spirit (not original to Descartes and not adopted by successors), the real distinction between mind and body (no one was persuaded), the proofs of God's existence (borrowed, and "only the ontological argument has sustained philosophers' interest"), and Descartes's analysis of reasons for error (Ben-Yami says no more about this, but we could start with Francis Bacon and work backwards). It is only the cogito that meets his standard. Of course "cogito" means for Ben-Yami not the argument of the first few paragraphs of the Meditations (where "cogito, ergo sum" does not appear) but rather beginning philosophy "from the point of view of the thinking subject as the primary source of certainty and constructing the philosophical system in this way, while attempting to eliminate any prior theoretical assumptions" (4).

Ben-Yami judges the cogito to be a failure on its own terms. "Modern Philosophy took a new turn not because of theory-free arguments built afresh on secure foundations, but because of scientific and technological developments." The resulting "new worldview was not developed by the method allegedly followed in the Meditations but was based on a synthesis of a variety of influences" (8). These influences determined some of the options and conclusions of the Meditations. And in fact what was truly original, enduring, and revolutionary was Descartes's integration into older traditions of "what the science of the age and the achievements and limitations of its technology seemed to demand" (8). Neither Descartes's revolution nor the revolution of modern philosophy are quite what they have been portrayed to be. Thus this book aims to effect a revolution in philosophical historiography and the interpretation of Descartes.

Chapters 2 through 6 take a long route before chapter 7's dismantling of claims that Meditations 1 and 2 are original and free of theoretical assumptions (there follows a recapitulative epilogue). Ben-Yami lays a foundation for this dismantling in chapters 2 and 3, arguing that the most revolutionary, original, and influential aspect of Descartes's thought was his theory of perception, which (argued in terms of color) moves the locus of color perception to the "mind," where only the idea of color is present in its immediacy. This idea is caused by the color in the thing seen, a causal color that does not actually resemble the idea of color in the mind because it is a physical disposition of the thing. The color idea represents in the mind the color of the thing, a representation that does not resemble what it represents but is determined by the brain's state (summarized on 24). The end of chapter 2 swiftly traces this theory's difference from prior theories, especially with respect to resemblance. Chapter 3 portrays Descartes's developing theory of perception from his earliest notebooks to the period of his mature philosophy, with special emphasis on how analytic geometry broke the connection between isomorphism and resemblance (consider, for example, the isomorphism without resemblance between an algebraic equation and its corresponding curve in the Cartesian plane). He also spends a long section (51-62) arguing that Descartes read Galileo's Assayer and was influenced by it to make physics purely material and to remove to the mind the sensed qualities of things.

Chapters 4 and 5 take a bit of a detour into Descartes's physiology and soul doctrine, along with how they were influenced by the machine and automaton technology of the late-sixteenth and early-seventeenth centuries. Despite its relatively short period of influence -- Descartes's physiology was already by the later decades of the seventeenth century considered disappointing -- Ben-Yami identifies another "decisive contribution" by Descartes (and thus probably revolutionary, though the author does not specifically use the term here) in relying only on the principles and laws of inorganic nature to explain living systems. Although "his position was premature for his age" (107) and lacked empirical support, his use of automatons and other new technology to illustrate the approach established a pattern of thinking that transformed the future. As chapter 5 argues, however, Descartes's analogies from what was relatively primitive technology contributed to his false conclusions that machines could not emulate the wide variety of human purposive behavior or the nearly universal competency of human beings to speak appropriately in any situation they encounter. (Here one wants to counter, however, that the mathematical "instruments" and the mechanics of motion he conceived were in effect machines of imagination as complicated as any actually produced in the next two centuries.) The falsity of Descartes's conclusion, Ben-Yami says, has been demonstrated by twentieth- and twenty-first-century practical and theoretical developments in computation.

The reasons for the detour into Descartes's physiology and theory of mind appear once we turn to the Meditations in chapters 6 and 7. Ben-Yami, who joins the long tradition of those who see the cultivation of science as Descartes's overriding motive, asks and answers the question of why the philosopher engaged in metaphysics (the other leading candidate for principal motive in Descartes historiography). The chief influence he identifies is Pierre de Bérulle, the founder of the Congregation of the Oratory and a Cardinal of the Roman Catholic Church. Bérulle persuaded Descartes to work out a metaphysics along Augustinian lines to help defend the Faith -- a task he promptly undertook, beginning in late autumn 1628. Ben-Yami treats this as something of an alien imposition, pointing out that in later years Descartes discounted the importance of metaphysics in comparison to the sciences, at least in terms of the time one ought to devote to each. (He omits that Descartes went on to urge correspondents to spend most of their time in ordinary conversation and living.) At this point Ben-Yami in effect turns to a variation of an old trope in Descartes studies -- insincerity -- without mentioning the word. The Meditations was a stratagem to make his scientific writings more palatable to the scholarly world. In passing, but with the final chapter in view, Ben-Yami discusses Descartes's notorious unwillingness to acknowledge intellectual influences and concludes with the moral-psychological diagnosis of vainglory (180).

The final chapter 7 looks at the first two Meditations as "Borrowed Themes with Original Variations" and is in particular alert to places where Descartes's arguments fail. Ben-Yami's strategy is to mark these as moments where the positions Descartes established in earlier works surreptitiously enter, with the ultimate aim of preparing the way for and justifying his science. So, for example, he says Descartes unaccountably invokes and then swiftly drops the secondary sense qualities in favor of the purely quantitative primary sense qualities -- unaccountable until you see that the shift supports his presuppositions (186-87). Ben-Yami of course invokes Descartes's famous assertion to Mersenne in a letter of 28 Jan. 1641 that the Meditations contains the foundations of his physics. Descartes's "new, 'external' world scepticism presupposes his developed metaphysics," which follows "from his complex, innovative world view, itself based on a variety of technological, scientific, methodological and other ideas. The declared method of the First Meditation, which attempts to discard any theoretical presuppositions, is indeed an illusion" (201). He concludes the chapter with sections on similarities to and differences from scepticism as it appears in Augustine's works and the reflections on the piece of wax, followed by a very brief adversion to the Third Meditation's material falsity of cold, the Fifth Meditation's discussion of the essence of material things, and the Sixth Meditation's conclusion that only the qualities of extension can be really ascribed to bodies. His aim is to show that these are weak, logically defective arguments that mask shifts serving Cartesian physics.

Thus we end at the antipode to the metaphysical tradition that culminated in Martial Gueroult's Descartes' Philosophy Interpreted According to the Order of Reasons, where everything in Descartes revolves around the Meditations and is made radically consistent with it. What presents itself as the main front of Descartes's philosophical revolution was a ruse -- and historically, if not philosophically, it worked.

The tradition of interpreting Descartes as always and everywhere a scientist has been susceptible to a hermeneutics of suspicion in view of his nonscientific writings. Both Protestant and Catholic opponents who suspected he was an atheist resorted to this hermeneutics, as did the French Enlightenment philosophes, who considered Descartes's metaphysical trappings as a concession to the political and religious forces of his day. Arguing against a suspicious hermeneut is often a fool's errand. As with conspiracy theories, if you fail to agree with a claim by introducing countervailing evidence there will be endless other claims adduced, and if you do not surrender you appear to the suspicious hermeneut as a naïf, a dupe, or a fool.

The only way left to respond is to point to ways in which you might view things differently and in different, arguably more appropriate contexts -- less for the benefit of the suspicious hermeneuts than for those who are not so prepossessed. About the Meditations in general we must at least entertain the possibility that it is genuinely a meditation, harking back through, and past, the spiritual exercises of Ignatius Loyola to half-millennium-old tradition of meditation with intellective as well as spiritual aims. This kind of meditation is not primarily a consideration of the truth or falsity of propositions but of things, and it circles around those things in order to find a way to move beyond them. More specifically, Ben-Yami is wrong in his characterization of the method of the Meditations as doubting everything and being theory-free. The specific doubt that drives them is whether things are as they present themselves to us -- put generically, it is motivated by wonder about how we can ever claim to know anything at all if we come into contact with nothing as it is. Should we criticize Descartes, then, for proceeding through doubtable things by ascending through the operations of soul-powers in a standard Aristotelian-Scholastic psychological staging that he does not expressly acknowledge: external senses, internal senses (including memory and imagination -- thus dreams as one of their operations), ratio and intellectus? One needs to delve deeper into the method he started developing in the Regulae to see what he is doing and why it is legitimate even if it represents to Ben-Yami an unargued theoretical commitment.

There are also issues of philosophical historiography and historiography pure and simple to consider. I mention just one. Ben-Yami's starting point, the question what is really revolutionary in Descartes, ought immediately to raise another question: revolutionary for whom? The history of science since the 1970s has entertained plenty of meta-reflection about this and similar questions. His invocation of originality and long-term influence are similarly unexamined even though they inflect the question of what revolutionary means away from Descartes's contemporary audience to the deep past, on the one hand, and the distant future, on the other. We learn almost nothing in Ben-Yami's book about Descartes's contemporary situation except when the issue is whether and how Descartes read Galileo's Assayer and what influence Bérulle might have had. These inquiries are driven, in the first case, by needing to ally Descartes with the modern project of science, and, in the second, by having to begin discounting the actual importance of metaphysics to Descartes.

Having mentioned several traditions of Descartes interpretation, let me add one more: the much more modest tradition of Ferdinand Alquié that understands the "metaphysical discovery of man" as at the heart of all Descartes's work. A sign of this tradition is a statement Descartes made in one of the richest letters he ever wrote, one that addresses science and metaphysics and anthropology and the aims of his life and work at a moment when, most scholars would agree, Descartes first discovered himself as we have come to know him:

I think that all those to whom God has given the use of reason are obligated to employ it principally for endeavoring to know him and to know themselves. It is thus that I endeavored to begin my studies; and I will say to you that I would not have known how to find the foundations of physics if I had not looked for them along that way (AT I, 144).

Pursuing the clues openly hidden in this statement would yield a more nicely equilibrated conception of Descartes as man, philosopher, and historical figure and influence than simply turning him into an actor playing on the stages of science and metaphysics.