Descartes's Changing Mind

Placeholder book cover

Peter Machamer and J.E. McGuire, Descartes's Changing Mind, Princeton University Press, 2009, 258pp, $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691138893.

Reviewed by Helen Hattab, University of Houston


The great virtue of Descartes's Changing Mind is that it recognizes philosophy as a human endeavor, acknowledging that even philosophical giants, such as the much celebrated and reviled Father of Modern Philosophy, like all humans, change their minds and revise their theories over time. This is a welcome antidote to the more common tendency to take the principle of charity to imply a fundamental unity and consistency within Descartes's corpus. Machamer and McGuire are thus to be congratulated for taking on the difficult task of providing a reading of Descartes's entire corpus, spanning over two decades and five completed works, that treats it as a dynamic progression, rather than a static system. In so doing, they pay careful attention to the historical chronology, the Scholastic background, Descartes's replies to his philosophical interlocutors, and the scholarship on issues central to Descartes's mature positions. The result is a rich and controversial story that always engages the reader even if it does not always convince.

The authors identify Descartes's shift to what they call the "epistemic stance" as the core difference between his early works, the Rules and The World, and the mature Principles of Philosophy and The Passions, with the Discourse and especially the Meditations and Objections and Replies being transitional. The epistemic stance that they see emerging in the Replies and reaching full fruition in the Principles is constituted by teleological and perspectivalist commitments involving "the claim that our knowledge is relative to what is required for our survival and sufficient to enable us to grasp cognitively what we need in order to do science" (x).

In support of their thesis, the authors explore three distinct but nestled spheres within Descartes's overall progression towards this epistemic stance, with 1) constituting the overarching development that they argue is driven by sub-developments 2) and 3):

1. Chapters 1, 5 -- The shift from abstractionist empiricism in the Rules to increasing skepticism regarding the resemblance between object and sensation, culminating in "the view that the core of our understanding is innately constituted by ideas that are virtually nonrepresentational in their formal reality" (5).

2. Chapters 1-3 -- The related shift from a realist ontology of simple natures in the Rules and The World to an increasing concern with metaphysical foundations, including:

a. the articulation of a theory of substance starting in the Discourse and ending in the substance/mode ontology of the Principles,

b. the consequent re-casting of extension as the principal attribute of matter, and

c. most importantly, the development of a causal theory in the Meditations and Replies prompting the re-conceptualization of God's conservation as an instant-by-instant re-creation, and the characterization of God as causa sui.

3. Chapter 4 -- The shift away from realism about the forces and powers attributed to bodies (driven by 2) towards an epistemic stance that allows us to have knowledge of the world thanks to God's causal harmony and the resultant epistemic teleology.

Finally, Chapter 6 discusses an important consequence of the epistemic stance, namely, that Descartes's so-called dualism must be understood in terms of his teleological view of knowledge and hence cannot be understood in terms of the traditional categories of dualism, interactionism and trialism.

In making their case, the authors tackle issues that have been the subject of heated debate in recent Descartes scholarship, most notably: whether Descartes is a mere conservationist, concurrentist or occasionalist with respect to secondary causation; the nature of body-body causation; and mind-body relations. In each case they survey and offer an alternative to some of the most common positions and arguments advanced in the recent literature. The overall thesis that Descartes's thought underwent significant transformation after the Meditations enables them to take more nuanced positions than a static reading of Descartes's corpus would allow. For example, they make sense of the numerous references to the activity of matter in The World by reading Descartes as a mere conservationist at this stage. Hence Descartes can attribute active forces to the nature of matter in his early works, without thereby undermining his later doctrine that the principal attribute of matter is extension. The later doctrine grows out of the causal theory Descartes begins to develop in the Meditations, which entails the rejection of mere conservationism. This is one among several examples where the developmental thesis succeeds in providing a more coherent picture of Descartes's thinking, thus illustrating the great advantage of the interpretive strategy adopted by the authors. However, it turns out to be a double edged sword, for there are other times when fitting Descartes's texts into this particular developmental narrative appears to take precedence over the careful interpretation of individual texts. One loses some of the individual trees to the forest, so to speak, and consequently, some shifts attributed to Descartes fail to convince. One representative example will serve as illustration, following which I will examine an argument that is central to the main thesis of the book.

Key evidence introduced for claim (1) -- that Descartes only later embraces innate ideas -- is that, in the Rules, Descartes is still an empiricist (knowledge originates in experience) who takes the simple natures to be known by a process of abstraction. Abstraction is characterized as follows: "When the mind performs an abstraction, certain features of an object are held attentively before it, while others are disregarded but not denied" (6). Intuition is equated with abstraction on the basis that: "an intuition is an insight into necessary connections between two simple ideas or elements of an idea. It is the product of attention that arises by the exclusion of irrelevant material that thereby leaves an idea's content clear and distinct" (7). Setting aside the fact that this is not the standard view of abstraction at this time, the supporting passages from Rules 12 and 14 are not carefully interpreted within their context. In Rule 12, Descartes does claim we are abstracting when we say that shape is the limit of an extended thing. But this does not imply that 'shape' is always an abstraction, for Descartes goes on to clarify that 'limit' is more general than shape since one can also talk about a limit of duration or motion. I.e., 'limit' is derived by abstraction from the simpler notions of shape, duration and motion and we treat shape as an abstraction only when we define it in terms of the more general concept of a limit. That is not to say that the clear and distinct notion of shape is itself derived by abstraction. Indeed, Descartes's text indicates that the simple notion of shape is not a product of abstraction for he goes on to characterize 'limit' as "something composed of many quite different natures"; i.e., unlike 'shape' it is not a simple notion that can be clearly and distinctly known (CSM I, 44). Hence the view that Descartes shifts from abstraction as the source of clear and distinct ideas in the Rules to the method of exclusion, and innate ideas, is problematic.

The authors further cite a passage in Rule 14 as evidence that the notion of shape is a result of their sense of abstraction. In this passage, Descartes states that we are able to carry the common idea of the shape over from a gold to a silver crown by a simple comparison that allows us to state that the silver crown is similar to the gold crown, in this respect. However, in this context, Descartes is not discussing how we arrive at the simple notion of shape, but rather arguing that "in all reasoning it is only by means of a comparison that we attain an exact knowledge of the truth" (CSM I, 57). His point is that once we have the simple notion of shape, we do not need syllogistic reasoning to conclude that the silver object is also a crown as we discover this by a simple comparison of the two shapes. The authors thus conflate two distinct types of knowledge that Descartes explicitly distinguishes: i) the "simple and pure intuition of a single solitary thing" and ii) a "comparison between two or more things" (CSM I, 57-58). Nothing in this discussion implies that i) is a form of abstraction. Descartes does go on, in Rule 14, to state that when we visualize a problem in terms of a particular shape, we consider the real extension of a body "in abstraction from everything about it save its having a shape" (CSM I, 58). We must keep in mind the context though: Descartes himself reminds the reader that "now we are making use of the imagination as an aid in solving problems" (CSM I, 56). I.e., we can abstract particular properties of bodies, including colors, by depicting them in the imagination as magnitudes and shapes in order to display more distinctly the different proportions involved. What Descartes offers here is a heuristic that involves abstracting certain properties so as to depict them in the imagination, not a theory of how the intellect forms the clear and distinct idea of shape.

The evidence in favor of a radical shift from abstractionist empiricism in the Rules to innate ideas thus falls short. However, one could still argue that the reliance on innate ideas becomes more pronounced and extensive in Descartes's later works, so this need not undermine the claim that Descartes moves towards an epistemic stance. But what about the arguments supporting the core thesis; i.e., that the shift from mere conservationism to re-creationism, which rules out the activity of matter, prompts Descartes to recast secondary causation in terms of sine quibus non conditions? It is this perceived shift that provides the primary motivation for the epistemic stance for:

The instantaneous creation of the world moment by moment, when brought together with Descartes's new and strict interpretation of creation and conservation as identical, requires him to find a way to describe God's orchestration of the motions and changes of things so that all creation is harmonious. He does not realize this fully as yet, but this decisive shift in ontology between The World and the Meditations now begins to pave the way for the emerging epistemic stance (127).

In short, Descartes adopts an epistemic teleology to ensure that we can have scientific knowledge of the world in the absence of insight into the ultimate natures of the bodies that occasion our ideas.

Against those who read Descartes's claim about the independence of the parts of time in Meditation III as compatible with God's concurrence with created causes, the authors argue that the parts of time must be both causally and logically independent. They base the causal independence of each part of time on the interpretation of the cogito as a performative act: "the cogito in Meditation II is mobilized as an intellectual performance tied intimately to the very moment of time in which it is performed" (64); i.e., "its truth is tied to each independent moment in which it is performed" (65). The second proof for the existence of God is then read as premised on the meditator's knowledge that "the performance of the cogito is temporally indexed, and that his existence is insured only in the very moment at which the cogito is performed" (65). Hence the cogito does not involve an awareness of continuous time; rather "its validity is an immediate intuition of a truth contained in an idea grasped in an instant, an intuition that contains no temporal successiveness, and the content of the I think is not prolonged through continuous time" (69-70). This is supposed to show that, in preserving the meditator, God must re-create his or her instantaneous thoughts moment by moment.

But how does this justification for a re-creationist reading square with what Descartes says elsewhere regarding human thought? In his subsequent correspondence with Arnauld, Descartes characterizes our thought as inherently successive: "And even if no bodies existed, it could still not be said that the duration of the human mind was all at once (tota simul) in the manner of the duration of God; because a succession is clearly seen in our thoughts" (AT V, 223). He adds that the successiveness of our thought is the very basis for our knowledge of the duration of things: "the before and after of any duration are known to me through the before and after of the successive duration which I detect in my own thought, with which the other things coexist" (AT V, 223). In the conversation with Burman, he is emphatic that no thought can take place in an instant, while introducing a distinction that prevents this from undermining the non-extended nature of thought: "Thought will indeed be extended and divisible with respect to its duration, since its duration can be divided into parts. But it is not extended and divisible with respect to its nature" (AT V, 148).

As the authors highlight, the fact that an act of thought cannot be instantaneous does not prevent the content of a thought from being true in an instant. But if it is merely the intuitive truthful content of the cogito that is instantaneous, then it is only this series of discrete contents of ideas that could be causally linked to a discrete series of divine acts of re-creation. Given that, for Descartes, the formal and objective reality of ideas each require a cause, this would not imply that the enduring, successive act of thinking that includes among its contents the instantaneous truth of the cogito is thereby also conserved by non-continuous divine acts of re-creation. To the contrary, does not the causal dependence go the other way? I.e., God conserves me as a thinking substance on which my acts of thinking and their contents (except the idea of God) depend. After all, it is the non-instantaneous act of thinking by which I sense, doubt and will, as well as arrive at truths, that constitutes my existence and requires God's conservation so as to not collapse into nothingness. If the instantaneous truth of the cogito's content sufficed to show that my enduring thinking self was also constituted by a discrete series of instantaneous thoughts, then either Descartes could not have insisted that no thought can take place in an instant or his proof would only guarantee that instantaneous, self-evident, intellectual intuitions were conserved as part of the self, not other thoughts (hence we would cease to exist while asleep). While intriguing, this argument does not decisively support re-creationism and the ensuing epistemic stance.

To encounter difficulties that change one's mind is human; hence absolute consistency is rare in any intellectual endeavor of a certain scope and complexity. But fresh approaches to well-worn paths that spark further thought and debate are rarer still and thus deserve our admiration, whether we are convinced by every argument or not. Descartes's Changing Mind accomplishes the latter, offering far more food for thought than the above sampler can encompass.