Descartes's Theory of the Mind

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Desmond M. Clarke, Descartes's Theory of the Mind, Oxford, 2003, 276pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199261237.

Reviewed by John Cottingham, University of Reading


The history of Cartesian scholarship over the last half-century has seen significant changes. There was a time when the image of Descartes as epistemologist was dominant: commentators saw him as preoccupied with the kinds of question in the ’theory of knowledge’ that exercise modern analytic philosophers— foundationalism, the external world, the refutation of scepticism, the argument from illusion, the ’dreaming argument’ and so on. Some of these discussions were carried on with scant regard for the actual historical and philosophical background against which Descartes himself operated; but as Cartesian commentators came to pay more attention to history and context, other, arguably far more central, themes in Descartes’s thought started to reclaim their rightful place in interpretations of his system.

One of the new images to have emerged as a result of this greater historical sensitivity is that of Descartes as scientist, or, to speak less anachronistically, that of Descartes as natural philosopher. (In part, this is a reversion to the older view, held for example by the great Cartesian scholar and editor Charles Adam, that Cartesian metaphysics and epistemology are essentially subordinate to Cartesian science.) Desmond Clarke’s latest book has as its “primary aim” to take us back to the “original Cartesian account of how human mental abilities may be explained partly by reference to the brain and other relevant physiological systems, and of why human thought displays properties that are irreducible to the properties of matter” (p. 13).

The latter issue, the irreducibility and sui generis nature of the mental, is of course the one that springs immediately to the fore whenever most modern philosophers talk of the Cartesian conception of the mind; but Clarke’s goal is to show how the actual Descartes was often as much or more preoccupied with working out the physical mechanisms that he saw as underpinning our mentation than he was with abstract arguments about the supposed dualistic separation of the mental from the physical.

The key motivation behind Descartes’s natural philosophy (including much of his work on the mind) is, for Clarke, the desire to provide a new style of explanation that would replace the scholastic approach that prevailed in the world in which he grew up. Much of this is uncontroversial: Descartes frequently complains of the explanatory vacuity of the “substantial forms and real qualities which many philosophers suppose to inhere in things” (Principia philosophiae, Part IV, art.198), objecting that they are “harder to understand than the things they are supposed to explain” (art. 201). His own mechanistic accounts, by contrast, were supposed to have an immediate intelligibility, since they simply ascribed to the micro world exactly the same kinds of interactions with which we are familiar from ordinary middle-sized phenomena around us. If we understand the latter, then we already have a grasp of how the posited micro events operate (“imperceptible simply because of their small size”); and the key idea is that these give rise to the relevant explananda in a way that is “just as natural” as explaining how a clock tells the time by reference to the little cogs and wheels inside it (art. 203). Much of Clarke’s study is taken up with patient exegesis of the way in which this programme was worked out with respect to the human nervous system, in Le Monde, the Traité de L’Homme and the Dioptrique. What we would nowadays call ’cognitive functions’, such as visual perception, are investigated by Descartes in terms of brain events of a certain kind (“ideas as brain patterns” is Clarke’s slogan). And the same applies to non-human animals, since as Clarke points out (quite correctly in my view) “Descartes readily concedes to animals everything that takes place in us apart from thought or reasoning” (p. 75).

Clarke goes on to trace out how the same corporealist strategy is used by Descartes in his accounts of imagination and memory, and of the passions; and what slowly and securely emerges is a valuable lesson for those who are so beguiled by the modern icon of Descartes the ’Cartesian dualist’ that they assume (a feat possible only if his scientific writings are resolutely ignored) that he must be far more interested in the ’ghost’ than in the machine.

But is Descartes interested in the ghost— the soul— at all? The sting in the tail of Clarke’s study (though he does not quite phrase it this way) is that Descartes’s notion of the immaterial res cogitans does not play any interesting role whatever in his philosophy. For in Clarke’s eyes the real driving force behind Descartes’s work was the programme for “genuine” (i.e. mechanistic) explanations of seeing, hearing, remembering, imagining and so on— a programme that “ran into apparently insurmountable obstacles” (241) when it came to dealing with the perspective of the thinking subject. The result, for Clarke, was a kind of impasse: Descartes did not really have a ’theory’ of an immaterial thinking substance; instead, his talk of a ’thinking thing’ was “true [but] uninformative” (257), a “provisional acknowledgement of failure, an index of the work that remains to be done before a viable theory of the human mind becomes available” (258).

The talk of “failure” is appropriate, Clarke suggests, because the Cartesian claims about thinking substances “add nothing new to our knowledge” of them. Descartes is “claiming no more than … that, if thinking is occurring, there must be a thinking thing of which the act of thinking is predicated” (221). So the attribute of thinking can no more be of explanatory value than the Schoolmen’s attribute of gravitas or ’heaviness’ was any use in explaining why heavy things fall.

The charge of explanatory vacuity seems right in one way, but strikes me nevertheless as misleading in so far as it tacitly assumes that Descartes must have approached the phenomenon of consciousness with a view to seeing if it could be explained after the manner of his mechanistic programme for physics. This is indeed what Gassendi thought he should be doing: it’s no more use telling us you are a ’thinking thing’, he objected, than telling us that wine is ’a red thing’; what we are looking for is the micro-structure that explains the manifest properties (Fifth Objections, AT VII 276: CSM II 193). Descartes’s reply is instructive: he was utterly scathing about the very idea that one might produce some ’quasi-chemical’ micro-explanation of thinking (Fifth Replies, AT VII 359: CSM II 248). In the context of the argument of the Meditations, which is the focus of this sharp exchange, we should recall that Descartes’s meditator has arrived at a self-conception of the mind which leads him directly forward on the journey to contemplate the “immense light” of the Godhead, the infinite incorporeal being whose image is reflected, albeit dimly, in the finite created intellect of the meditator (AT VII 51: CSM II 35). So whatever else the notion of res cogitans may or may not do, it clearly plays a central role in the development of Descartes’s theocentric metaphysics.

Descartes’s scientific ambitions were, to be sure, a crucial part of his philosophical project, and Clarke’s careful and persuasive exploration of them provides an important addition to the literature; but to understand the full picture we need to see how Descartes’s system was shaped not just by the early-modern revolution in physics that he helped create, but by the older contemplative and immaterialist tradition of Plato and Augustine that remained at the centre of his world view. Having rightly acknowledged Descartes the scientist, it is time to rehabilitate Descartes the metaphysician.