Descartes' System of Natural Philosophy

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Gaukroger, Stephen, Descartes' System of Natural Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 258pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521005256.

Reviewed by Ed Slowik, Winona State University


Although largely neglected over the past few centuries, Descartes’ natural philosophy (i.e., science) has lately undergone a sort of renaissance of academic interest. A host of new publications on this topic, from such renowned scholars as Alan Gabbey, Dan Garber, Denis Des Chene, and Stephen Gaukroger, have helped to make Descartes’ science one of the more profitable and revelatory areas of recent Cartesian study (to paraphrase a comment of Dan Garber’s from several years ago: “Its easy to be original when doing Descartes’ science, since nobody does it”). Stephen Gaukroger’s new book on Descartes’ science is a nice addition to this distinguished body of work. Overall, it can be seen as a companion piece to his earlier work Descartes, An Intellectual Biography (Oxford, 1995) which also concentrated on Cartesian science. The new book, however, focuses upon Descartes’ most important treatise on natural philosophy, The Principle of Philosophy, published in 1644.

In both of his books, Gaukroger demonstrates in great detail that Descartes’ principal interests throughout his career centered upon topics that fall under “natural philosophy”, such as statics, mechanics, optics, physiology, etc. (as well as mathematics). For the many generations of philosophers (and college freshman) who only know Descartes as the author of the Meditations, a purely metaphysical and epistemological work, the realization that Descartes was “more physicist than metaphysician” (if one can use this description) may come as a great surprise. Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy, is an excellent case in point: Part I provides a synopsis of the foundational epistemology contained in the Meditations and is roughly 30 pages long, while the remaining 300 pages of the work comprise Descartes’ elaborate analysis of the behavior of physical bodies, the universe, and the Earth. The Principles, in fact, qualifies as Descartes’ most ambitious project, for it amounts to an attempt to encapsulate his overall mechanist conception of natural philosophy in a textbook format that rivals, as well as refutes, the Scholastic philosophical textbooks still in use at that time. Gaukroger’s book on Cartesian science is unique in that it constitutes an in depth examination of the Principles as a single or complete work, focusing upon its various subparts and topics, its general structure, and its relationship to the Scholastic textbook tradition that motivated its creation. Previous surveys of Cartesian science have not utilized this format, but have often simply examined the chronological development of Descartes’ ideas over the many separate texts that span his career. (Gaukroger does indeed discuss other sources when necessary, although he is careful to tie the discussion to the relevant portion of the Principles.)

As for the organization of Gaukroger’s text, the middle chapters follow the general outline of the Parts of the Principles: chapters 3 through 6 provide a critical analysis of Parts I through IV (respectively, the principles of knowledge, material objects, the visible universe, and the Earth). For many Early-Modern students and scholars, however, the unique and most intriguing aspects of Gaukroger’s work may lie in the second chapter, which examines the structure of the Principles and its place in the Scholastic textbook tradition. Many interesting questions that are seldom discussed in treatments of Cartesian natural philosophy are taken up in this chapter, such as the reasons for Descartes’ exclusion of a section on logic in the Principles (a choice that runs counter to the overall Scholastic textbook tradition), as well as his decision to begin the Principles with his summary of the Meditations. While the first chapter provides an overview of Descartes’ natural philosophy prior to the Principles, the remaining two chapters (7 and 8) once again break new ground by offering a hypothetical or conjectural reconstruction of the unwritten Parts V and VI. In these final two projected portions of the Principles, Descartes had intended to complete his analysis of the physical world by analyzing, respectively, “living things” (animals and plants) and “man”. Gaukroger is almost certainly correct in inferring that Descartes would have probably re-used, and rewritten, his earlier compositions on living things in L’Homme and La Description du Corps Humain for Part V. Likewise, Part VI would have doubtless included the material that eventually surfaced in Les Passions of 1649, which extends the discussion of living things into the intricate realm of human psychology. Consequently, not only does Gaukroger incorporate material from diverse areas of Descartes’ natural philosophy within a single book (a rarity, given the growing specialization in Cartesian studies), but also the inclusion of this material helps to make Gaukroger’s case for the importance of the Principles as an exhaustive compendium of his mature philosophical views in all areas of natural philosophy.

One of Gaukroger’s main contentions is that Descartes tried to provide a justification for his natural philosophy “where the aim is to engage Scholastic philosophy, to some extent on its own terms, and in effect to reform and transform Scholasticism into Cartesian natural philosophy” (p.31). In true Scholastic fashion, Descartes thus strived for a secure metaphysical foundation on which to build his natural philosophy, a foundation which he allegedly found in the cogito argument and its subsequent guarantee of the veracity of “clear and distinct” ideas. Gaukroger argues that Descartes’ metaphysical arguments in the Principles parallel a similar maneuver in his earlier attempts to secure an intuitive grasp of mathematics. In the Regulae (of the 1620s), he employed a process that only relied on line lengths and the operations that can be performed on them, in an effort to derive all mathematical truths (although he ultimately abandoned this attempt). Just as we can immediately grasp the truth of, say, “2+3=5”, by conjoining a two-unit line and a three-unit line, so Descartes may have believed that our intuitive and certain understanding of the cogito argument (the colloquial “I think, therefore I am”) could provide an equally secure basis for his natural philosophy. As Gaukroger points out, nevertheless, the limitations of this kind of metaphysical justification are readily apparent in the failure of the cogito argument, as well as the appeal to the “ontological” argument for God’s existence, to even remotely match whatever level of “certainty” can be discerned in adding line lengths (pp.82-82).

As these sections of the book illustrate, Gaukroger is careful to pinpoint the metaphysical justification that underlies the deductive structure of the Principles: much like the Scholastic textbooks that motivated its creation, Descartes’ natural philosophy in the Principles is supposedly derived from his metaphysics. What Gaukroger fails to address adequately, however, is the overall implication of the numerous instances where Descartes violates his derivative structure by introducing, somewhat randomly, a host of hypotheses and principles that are not specifically presented or deduced in Part I of the Principles. These hypotheses are often quite crucial for the conclusions that Descartes hopes to establish in his natural philosophy, but there is little metaphysical or epistemological justification given for their presence in this allegedly tight-knit deductive work. Some of these hypotheses are Scholastically-based metaphysical concepts, such as those of the logic of contrary properties, while others are apparently drawn from the common stock of presumed truths of seventeenth-century natural philosophy, such as the choice of “size times speed” as a measure of conserved motion. As for the former, Descartes employs the logic of contrary properties in obtaining his first law of motion, since “nothing moves by virtue of its own nature towards its opposite or own destruction” (Part II, article 37). That is, rest is an opposite and contrary state to motion, and since these states cannot (via the invoked Scholastic principle) transform into one another, it follows that a body at rest remains at rest and a body in motion remains in motion (which is Descartes’ first law). This is a fascinating point in the evolution of Descartes’ natural philosophy (if not science in general), for it reveals the use of a Scholastic/Medieval argument to ground what is possibly the most important concept in the formation of modern science, namely inertia (or at least the rudiments of the modern concept of inertia—by the way, there can be no better illustration than this argument for how truly Descartes’ natural philosophy straddles the Medieval and Early Modern world views). Unfortunately, it is not apparent just how the contrary-properties hypothesis is supposed to follow from the cogito argument and the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas; in fact, the contrary property hypothesis is never fully articulated in the work, but merely employed in this instance. Overall, the most plausible answer to this puzzling introduction of a non-deduced argument-form would seem to be that Descartes simply recalled this useful hypothesis from his previous acquaintance with the Scholastic textbooks and/or his earlier Scholastic training, and then proceeded to adapt it to his own purposes in the Principles. Just as in the case of the conserved quantity of motion, which was probably borrowed directly from his earlier investigation of statics (as Gaukroger notes, p.115), Descartes’ “derivation” of his natural philosophy in the Principles often pulls arguments and concepts out of philosophical thin air without the slightest preparation or attempt at metaphysical/epistemological justification. Of course, Gaukroger does note these types of inclusions at various points in his narrative, but his work would have given a more accurate picture of the Principles if he would have stressed more consistently the somewhat hybrid or schizophrenic character of Descartes major opus: that is, on the surface it presents itself in the form of a Scholastic deduction from certain first principles, but underneath it is largely a loose amalgam of diverse but fruitful seventeenth century mechanistic concepts and Scholastic and Early-Modern metaphysical arguments.

As for the content of Gaukroger’s discussion of the separate Parts of the Principles, the chapters alternate between summary of Descartes’ views and critical commentary, although the critical commentary is not as elaborate as one finds in, for example, Garber’s or Des Chene’s recent books on Cartesian physics. Yet, Gaukroger is not confining his examination to just Descartes’ physics, but is striving to present an overview of the entire range of topics intended for the Principles, and thus the increased scope must limit the extent of the critical analysis. Even given the more confined level of discussion, Gaukroger does make a number of important observations on the content of Cartesian science. In the chapters on physics and cosmology, in fact, Gaukroger carefully diagnoses the apparent conflation of the kinematic and dynamic elements in Descartes’ system, and draws some much needed attention to the very revealing letter to Henry More (15 April, 1649) that documents this largely neglected puzzle (but, also see W. Shea’s, The Magic of Numbers and Motion, and E. Slowik’s, Cartesian Spacetime).

There are, of course, aspects of Gaukroger’s analysis that commentators may find problematic, or where the arguments could have been augmented in making the relevant point (but this is true of all such texts). For instance, Gaukroger’s explanation of the blending of the kinematic and dynamic in Descartes’ physics would have benefited from a closer investigation of the dual role of the conservation law for quantity of motion, or size times speed. On the one hand, quantity of motion is non-instantaneous, since it includes the Cartesian concept of speed, which is only manifest over a non-instantaneous temporal period. Yet, quantity of motion is also implicated in the instantaneous property that he frequently entitles “tendency”, “striving”, or “first preparation for motion”. He states: “Of course, no motion is accomplished in an instant; but it is obvious that every moving body, at any moment in the course of its motion, is determined to persevere in its motion in some direction along a straight line, … .” (Part II, article 39) Moreover, in discussing the motions of stars, he uses the term “agitation” to signify the force, or measure of the force, of these tendencies: “Once moved, gold, lead, or other metals retain more agitation, or force to persevere in their motion, than pieces of wood or rocks do of the same size and shape.” (Part III, article 122). The descriptions of the agitation force in Part III of the Principles thus correlates with his earlier definition (in Part II) of a moving body’s quantity of motion, which is a measurement of its “force to persevere in its motion, i.e., in motion at the same speed in the same direction” (Part II, article 43). Quantity of motion is hence a gauge of agitation force, and since the agitation force is a measurement of a body’s instantaneous tendency towards motion, quantity of motion therefore seems to provide two primary functions: first, it is a measure of non-instantaneous “size times speed”; and second, it is a measure of instantaneous tendencies towards motion. If the former can be described as kinematic (since it only involves size and speed), and the second as dynamic (since instantaneous tendencies are closely akin to the “virtual velocities”-like tradition in the statics of Descartes’ day), then quantity of motion can be seen to incorporate both, which nicely augments Gaukroger’s case for the kinematic/dynamic ambiguity that lies at the heart of Cartesian physics.

Leaving aside such suggestions, however, Gaukroger’s book provides many insights into the structure and function of Descartes’ natural philosophy and should provoke fruitful discussions in the relevant areas of Cartesian and Early Modern study.