Descartes' Theory of Ideas

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David Clemenson, Descartes' Theory of Ideas, Continuum, 2007, 162pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826487735.

Reviewed by Dan Kaufman, University of Colorado


It is now widely-acknowledged that Descartes' relationship to his scholastic predecessors is incredibly complex. At times, Descartes appears to want to distance himself as far as possible from scholastic philosophy; at other times, Descartes is more than happy to help himself to generous portions of scholastic philosophy. Although Gilson's Index scolastico-cartésien (1912) has been an invaluable resource for nearly a century, it is only in recent decades that English-language scholars have fully recognized that knowledge of late scholastic thought is crucial for an understanding of Descartes and early modern philosophy in general.

David Clemenson's Descartes' Theory of Ideas is a welcome addition to the recent literature placing Descartes in the context of the final days of scholasticism. It joins Dennis Des Chene's Physiologia, Jorge Secada's Cartesian Metaphysics, and Tad Schmaltz's Descartes on Causation as a significant contribution to our understanding of the scholastic background and context in which Descartes wrote. Clemenson's book, as is clear from its title, focuses on Descartes' theory of perception and ideas and its attendant problems, perhaps more so than any other previous work on Descartes. It is rigorously researched and well-argued. Furthermore, Clemenson's interpretation of Descartes on ideas is one of the more provocative scholarly views I have encountered, and it is sure to cause a reaction -- positive or negative -- from scholars working on Descartes and early modern philosophy.

On the face of it, Descartes' theory of ideas seems to embrace aspects of both representationalism and direct realism. If we take representationalism to be the thesis that the only things we immediately perceive are mind-dependent things (i.e. ideas or representations), and we take direct realism to be the thesis that at least some of the things we immediately perceive are mind-independent things, then it seems that they exclude one another. There is good textual evidence that Descartes is a representationalist -- in fact, until recently, that was the 'standard way' of reading Descartes -- and there is good textual evidence that Descartes is a direct realist. This tension in Descartes' thought is Clemenson's starting point.

In the introductory chapter, Clemenson presents a brief initial statement of the direct realist/representationalist problem in Descartes, as well as the 'Dual-Presence Thesis', which Clemenson thinks resolves Descartes' problem. A second and very important part of the introductory chapter is Clemenson's discussion of what he calls 'the La Flèche Texts'. I found this part especially interesting. Clemenson claims that Descartes' theory of ideas is well developed by the time of the Meditations (1641). So, in attempting to figure out the possible influences on Descartes' theory of ideas, Clemenson is concerned with which late scholastic works Descartes would have been familiar with by the time of the Meditations. Two considerations guide Clemenson's investigation: first is Descartes' claim in the 30 September 1640 letter to Mersenne that he remembers "only the Coimbrans, Toletus, and Rubius" (AT III 185). Second is the Jesuit Ratio studiorum. Clemenson arrives at a list of works that satisfy two conditions: that they are likely to have been read by Descartes, given the Ratio studiorum at La Flèche and Descartes' remark about the scholastics he remembers, and that they contain a non-negligible amount of discussion of theories of cognition. The La Flèche Texts, according to Clemenson, include Aristotle commentaries by Pedro da Fonseca, Antonio Rubio, Francisco Toletus, and the so-call Coimbran Commentators, and we have no strong reason to include others. In claiming this, Clemenson is challenging a prevalent view among Descartes scholars, namely that the scholastic philosophers most likely to have been read carefully by Descartes are the great Jesuit, Francisco Suarez, and by late 1640, Eustachius a Sancto Paulo. It is Clemenson's contention that Suarez's influence on Descartes is greatly overstated, at least during his philosophically formative years. If Suarez is an influence on Descartes, it is only later, after the Meditations, after Descartes' theory of ideas is already developed. The same is true for Eustachius, whose Summa quadrapartita Descartes knew but only after his theory of ideas was developed.

The second chapter provides an informative introduction to relevant aspects of sixteenth-century scholastic ontology and the theory of perception as found in the La Flèche Texts, for instance the central notions of essence, esse, objective reality, numerical identity, and real distinction. Chapter three contains Clemenson's detailed defense of the Dual-Presence Thesis, which I will discuss shortly. In the fourth and final chapter, Clemenson takes on a well-known topic in Descartes scholarship, namely material falsity. Despite the fact that much has been written on material falsity, especially in recent decades, Clemenson manages to provide a fresh and plausible interpretation of this sticky issue.

The book is short, less than one hundred pages in the main text, but it contains nearly sixty pages of endnotes. I am not sure why more of the material contained in the endnotes is not in the main text. Nevertheless, the endnotes contain some of the most fascinating and crucial material in the book. I learned at least as much from the endnotes as I did from the main text.

Clemenson's central and most provocative claim is that Descartes holds the Dual-Presence Thesis (DPT) and that DPT resolves the tension between the representationalist and direct realist strands of Descartes' theory of ideas. Suppose that I have an idea of x and x exists extra-mentally. What is the relationship between the two? I have suggested elsewhere that they should be understood as 'counterparts' in the following sense: the idea of x is the (objective) counterpart of the extra-mental x, iff if there were an extra-mental x, then the idea of x would be the extra-mental x. This relation of objective and formal counterparts is not one of identity.[1] Clemenson's DPT claims something stronger. According to DPT, (1) there is numerical identity between x qua representation and x qua represented, and yet (2) there is a real distinction between x qua representation and x qua represented. Taking an example from Descartes' reply to Caterus, Clemenson states that "I immediately perceive the sun in the sky by immediately perceiving the sun in my mind, because the second is numerically identical to the first" (51). There is, of course, prima facie textual evidence for the claim of numerical identity. After all, Descartes does tell Caterus that the objective being of the sun just is the sun in so far as it exists in the mind. The second claim, that the representation and the represented are really distinct is founded on the Cartesian view that it is sufficient for a real distinction that it is possible that the terms of the distinction exist separately. Descartes certainly recognizes that it is possible to have an idea of x without there being an extra-mental x corresponding to the idea, and it is possible that there is an extra-mental x without there being any idea of x. So, x qua representation and x qua represented are really distinct. In a passage bringing (1) and (2) together, Descartes states: "if by 'essence' we understand a thing as it is objectively in the intellect, and by 'existence' the same thing, as it is outside the intellect, it is manifest that those two are really distinct" (AT IV 350, emphasis mine).

DPT resolves the representationalist/direct realist tension in Descartes, according to Clemenson, by being both a 'weak representationalism' and a 'weak direct realism'. It is weak direct realism insofar as there is immediate perception of things that are numerically identical to extra-mental things. It is weak representationalism insofar as the immediate objects of perception are in the mind and really distinct from the extra-mental objects represented. As Clemenson states, "according to the Dual Presence Thesis, concepts in the mind immediately represent things outside it, by being numerically identical to them" (49).

The DPT, as Clemenson admits, is likely to strike readers as odd, implausible, and perhaps even impossible. How does Clemenson argue for this interpretation of Descartes? He first lays the groundwork by showing that a similar view is found in some of the La Flèche Texts. So, at the very least there seems to be a scholastic precedent for the view that it is possible that numerically identical things are also really distinct, although I find the primary textual evidence from Fonseca much less conclusive than Clemenson does. But even if the scholastics held that there can be a real distinction between numerically-identical things, it doesn't follow that Descartes held this; in fact, in the absence of textual evidence from Descartes, it doesn't even make it more likely than not that Descartes held this view.

In order to bolster his claim that Descartes holds DPT, Clemenson appeals to the 9 February 1645 letter to Mesland in which Descartes claims that he has the same (idem) body that he had ten years before "because the numerical unity of a human body does not depend on its matter, but on its form, which is the soul …" (AT IV 346). Although Descartes does not explicitly say so, Clemenson thinks that Descartes is "committed" to the real distinction between his body at t and his body at t+10 because it is possible that either exists without the other existing; and the possibility of x existing without y (and vice versa) is sufficient for a real distinction. This raises an interesting question, namely whether Descartes allows a real distinction to obtain between temporally-disjoint substances. Of course, Descartes holds that it is possible that his body exists at t and fails to exist at t+10 (and vice versa), but is this enough to 'commit' him to a real distinction between them in the technical sense of 'real distinction'? If it is, then real distinctions are more abundant than we imagined. There would then be a real distinction between my body and Socrates' body, not to mention a real distinction between my body and the body of the 250th President of the United States. Because Descartes thinks that there is no instant of time (or state of the world at that time) which entails the continued existence of any creature, the table at which I type right now would be really distinct from the table at which I wrote one second ago, according to Clemenson's reading of Descartes. To be sure, I am not shy about granting an abundance of real distinctions in the world, but we need more evidence before accepting that Descartes' technical sense of 'real distinction' is applicable to temporally-disjoint substances and substances at different times.

Clemenson, however, does not rest his case for DPT on the Mesland letter. He also employs (among other things) the case of the mind-body union to illustrate how a genuine unity (genuinely one and the same thing) could be really distinct. Unfortunately, I think the comparison of the identity of x-qua-representation and x-qua-represented to the unity of the mind-body union misses the mark. Consider what is going on in each case: in the case of the mind-body union, a mind and a body are united, but it is not the case that the mind is identical to the body -- that would be utterly uncartesian! On the contrary, both the mind and the body are proper parts of the mind-body union.[2] The mind and the body are really distinct, but they are also numerically-distinct. If anything, it is the union that is an unum per se, but the union is not identical to either the mind or the body. The DPT, as I understand it, claims that the real sun and the idea of the sun are numerically-identical but really distinct, not that they are really distinct and numerically-distinct proper parts of some unum per se. The case of the mind-body union, then, is not helpful to Clemenson's case for DPT.

I wish to mention one more interesting and problematic aspect of DPT, one which Clemenson takes great pains to accommodate. According to Clemenson, the numerical identity of x-qua-representation and x-qua-represented is not a relation that has the typical properties of the identity relation. For instance, the identity relation, as it obtains between x-qua-representation and x-qua-represented is not symmetric or transitive, nor does the indiscernibility of identicals hold. Consider Descartes' Third Meditation argument for the existence of God in which he establishes that God exists objectively because God exists extra-mentally; that is, God must be the cause of the objective representation of God. But causation is an asymmetric relation, whereas identity is symmetric. So, on Clemenson's DPT, it is possible that x = y in cases where x is the efficient cause of y. Clemenson gets around this apparent problem by claiming that 'qua F' is an intensional context; so we should expect the typical results of dealing with identity in intensional contexts. I wonder, however, whether this is a dangerous door to open with respect to Descartes. First of all, Clemenson's suggestion seems to commit Descartes to the view that numerical identity is a contingent relation, depending on whether the representation (or represented) exists. It strikes me that Descartes would not be happy accepting contingent identity because, among other things, his arguments for the real distinction (and numerical non-identity) of mind and body seem to rest on the (anachronistically) Kripkean view that if x = y, then □(x = y). But Clemenson's Descartes is committed to the contingent identity of x-qua-representation and x-qua-represented. Therefore, the necessity of identity that Descartes relies on elsewhere does not generalize completely. This seems problematic. Clemenson, however, does seem to hold that the necessity of identity holds between things with the same 'qua-index', i.e. the sun-qua-real is necessarily the sun-qua-real. My point is simply that any case of merely contingent identity would be detrimental to Descartes, especially his argument for the real distinction between (and non-identity of) mind and body.

Part of a reviewer's job is to find problematic aspects of a work, and I have attempted to isolate some in Clemenson's book. Now that I have done that, I can conclude with well-deserved praise of the book. Clemenson has written a book that will be invaluable to anyone working on Descartes, as well as to those working on late scholastic thought and its relation to modern philosophy. His interpretation of Descartes (DPT), as we have seen, is incredibly provocative and will generate much discussion among scholars. Clemenson's knowledge and treatment of the relevant texts, both the obvious and the utterly obscure, is carefully presented, and his discussion of the technical late scholastic texts is clear without being pedantic. My one major complaint about the book is the obscene price. I strongly suggest that Continuum Press publish an affordable paperback edition of this book as soon as possible.

[1] Dan Kaufman. 2000. "Descartes on the Objective Reality of Materially False Ideas." Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 81, 385-408.

[2] See AT VII 221-222, 228-229; CSM II 156-157, 160-161, AT III 460-461, 508; CSMK 200, 209.