Describing Inner Experience? Proponent Meets Skeptic

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Russell T. Hurlburt and Eric Schwitzgebel, Describing Inner Experience? Proponent Meets Skeptic, MIT Press, 2007, 322pp., $34.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262083669.

Reviewed by Gualtiero Piccinini, University of Missouri, St. Louis


This book is a treat.  A psychologist (Hurlburt) and a philosopher (Schwitzgebel) join forces to interview a young college graduate (Melanie).  They ask Melanie what she experiences at randomly selected times.  They debate what Melanie reports and what can be learned from it.  They often disagree -- but in a candid, humble, and open-minded way.  Their imaginative and insightful dialogue, lightly edited, is transcribed in this book.  It is an invigorating challenge to philosophers and psychologists alike.

Background:  Experimental psychology began using introspection in the 19th Century:  psychologists trained subjects to privately "observe" and report on the contents of their conscious minds.  But psychologists could not resolve their disputes using this method.  Later generations abandoned introspection in favor of other methods.  As much as they could, they avoided asking subjects what they were experiencing.

Some psychologists, such as Hurlburt, were unsatisfied with this state of affairs.  Instead of ignoring what subjects have to say about their minds, he set to improve on the old introspectionist methods.  Over 30 years, Hurlburt -- with help from some colleagues -- developed a technique called "descriptive experience sampling" (DES).  DES works roughly as follows.  Hurlburt gives a subject a random beeper.  As the subject hears a beep, she writes down what she was experiencing just before the beep.  The next day, Hurlburt interviews the subject, asking for more details and correcting mistakes.  The outcome is a way to investigate subjective experience that is both more rigorous and more powerful than old-fashioned introspection.  Or so he believes.

Schwitzgebel is as rare a philosopher as Hurlburt is a psychologist.  Most philosophers believe that if people know anything, they know at least the current content of their experience.  Schwitzgebel maintains just the opposite.  In recent years, he has established himself as perhaps the most imaginative and systematic critic of introspection.  His doubts, as it happens, apply to Hurlburt's DES.

Undeterred, Hurlburt invited Schwitzgebel to scrutinize DES with him.  They enlisted Melanie, gave her a beeper, and interviewed her on six separate days.  During each interview, Hurlburt derives conclusions about Melanie's experiences; Schwitzgebel challenges them.  But the scope of the debate extends well beyond Melanie's conscious life.  While discussing the details of specific experiences, they shed light on a wide range of topics.  These include inner speech, mental imagery, emotions, and memory, to name a few.

Try to answer this question honestly, if you can:  what does your current thought feel like?  Is it like an image?  It is like language?  If you resemble me, you believe some thoughts feel like images, while others feel like language.  At any rate, mental images and inner language are, historically, the popular ways of thinking about conscious thinking.  According to Hurlburt, this dichotomy between images and language is a false one -- a prejudice due to armchair introspection and faulty assumptions.  (Armchair introspection, the common but fallacious attempt to rely on introspection without serious methodological checks, is a favorite target of Hurlburt's polemic -- and rightly so, given its poor track record.)

Among Hurlburt's empirical findings, the most surprising is what he calls "unsymbolized thoughts" -- thoughts without an experienced vehicle.  Many mental contents are experienced as being carried by a vehicle, which may be either a mental image or an inner linguistic episode.  By contrast, unsymbolized thoughts have definite propositional contents, such as "the cat is chasing the dog", but they are experienced without experiencing either images or inner speech.  Unsymbolized thinking flies in the face of the conventional wisdom.  How can there be content without a vehicle?

Hurlburt does not say that unsymbolized thinking actually occurs without a vehicle.  All he says is that unsymbolized thinking is experienced by subjects without experiencing a vehicle for it.  Still, the notion of unsymbolized thinking is provocative.  As Hurlburt points out, people often resist it.  For the conventional wisdom is not only that thinking requires a vehicle, which is true enough; it's also that mental contents are always experienced as being the contents of either an image or a linguistic vehicle.  If Hurlburt is right, this is radically false.

Initially, when I read about unsymbolized thinking, I was not persuaded.  As I kept reading, though, I remembered times when my thoughts felt almost instantaneous, without anything like an inner sentence or image accompanying them.  I did my own sloppy version of DES on myself and I changed my mind.  Thanks to Hurlburt, I now believe I have unsymbolized thoughts.

All of this would be more convincing if DES were a good scientific method.  Well, is it?  This is the core question of the book.  It is also an instance of a more general question:  Are methods that rely on subjects' reports about their minds legitimate science?  With the rise of consciousness studies in the last couple of decades, the legitimacy and reliability of "introspective" methods have been heavily debated.  Some people argue that introspection is reliable and hence legitimate.  Others doubt it.  At the heart of this disagreement lies the assumption that introspection involves private, inner "observation".  If introspection is private, says the skeptic, it is unverifiable.  Thus, we can't take it at face value.  Perhaps we should treat its output as a work of fiction (Dennett 1991).  The believer retorts that introspection is too useful to discard, so we should trust it even if it's private (Goldman 1997, Chalmers 2004).  The problem with this is that the believer has no means of validating introspection -- he has to trust it on faith.

The way out of this impasse is to reject the mistaken notion that the (rigorous) production and use of introspective data requires a kind of private observation.  If we construe introspection as a process that yields public data, which is up to psychologists to validate (using public procedures), we avoid the whole conundrum of private-hence-untestable introspection (Piccinini 2003a).  The crux lies in finding ways of validating data from introspective reports.

Within this broader debate, DES fits as follows:  Does DES involve private observations, or are there public ways of validating its results?  Surprisingly, Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel say they don't care much about private ("first-person") vs. public ("third-person") methods (217).  They seem to think it doesn't matter for establishing what may be learned from DES reports.  But it does matter.  If DES reports were descriptions of private observations, they couldn't be independently validated.  If so, they wouldn't belong in a genuine science of the mind.  For science is based on public methods (Piccinini 2003b).

Occasionally, Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel's words suggest DES does involve a private component.  For instance, they introduce introspective data as the outcome of a subject's "observation" (5).  Thinking of it as observation is conducive to the methodological nightmares of "first-person science", because such private observations are unverifiable.

But most of what Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel say and do in the book shows DES to be a public method.  For one thing, they explicitly say that DES reports can be independently tested and validated.  Even Schwitzgebel -- the putative skeptic -- does not accuse DES reports of being untestable.  On the contrary, he says they can be checked, although it may be difficult (54, 223).  If, in fact, data from DES reports can be validated by independent methods, then DES is scientifically legitimate.  The question is, can they be validated?

As a preliminary step, we should avoid the temptation -- to which philosophers are especially prone -- to attempt to validate DES as a whole, perhaps on the grounds of some a priori consideration.  To be sure, Hurlburt begins his defense of DES with ten "plausibility arguments" (27-31).  Some are question-begging (e.g., DES is "sophisticated"; subjects say their reports are accurate).  But others are helpful, because they give evidence that certain confounding factors are absent from DES (e.g., reports are consistent with independently established constraints on cognition; Hulrburt is good at maintaining theoretical neutrality while interviewing subjects, as Schwitzgebel acknowledges).  This makes sense within a third-person methodology, whereas it wouldn't within a first-person methodology.  But none of the plausibility arguments are sufficient to validate DES, nor does Hurlburt maintain that they are.

Rather than validating DES reports globally, Hurlburt argues that we should do it locally, one subject at a time.  Instead of asking, "Does DES-apprehended inner experience faithfully mirror inner experience?", we should ask, "Does the DES-apprehended inner experience of Allen [or Melanie, or whomever else] faithfully mirror her inner experience?" (32).  Hurlburt proceeds to describe the case of Fran.  Fran's reports led Hurlburt to hypothesize that she could experience several mental images at the same time and, more generally, maintain several conscious mental processes simultaneously.  This hypothesis generated testable predictions, which were confirmed.  In addition, some of Fran's strange behaviors (watching three TVs at the same time, counting money while having an unrelated conversation), discovered by Hurlburt after forming his hypothesis, were readily explainable by his hypothesis.  This is convincing evidence that Fran's DES reports led to fertile conclusions.  Even Schwitzgebel seems to agree (224).

In the case of Melanie, Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel do not uncover anything as striking as Fran's experiences, nor do they test her reports by independent methods.  Instead, they discuss what may be learned from her reports in light of her other reports, Hurlburt's findings from other subjects, experimental results from psychology, and more or less plausible assumptions about mental processes.  Hurlburt is inclined to believe most of what Melanie says (though not all) and to defend its plausibility, while Schwitzgebel is more inclined to criticize what Melanie says (though not all).  Their exchange is sensible and fruitful, based as it is on public evidence and explicit assumptions.

Sometimes, Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel seem to underestimate the extent to which there already is independent evidence supporting DES.  They barely mention the painstaking experimental work in the Ericsson and Simon tradition (Ericsson and Simon 1993).  Ericsson and Simon showed that several types of "introspective" reports yield valid data under many circumstances.  Although the methods of Ericsson and Simon are somewhat different from DES, some of their findings are relevant.  For example, Schwitzgebel suggests that many details reported by DES subjects may be made up, because the interviews occur up to 24 hours after the experiences.  Subjects may have forgotten their experiences, leading them to insert fictitious information in their reports.  But Ericsson and Simon showed that retrospective reports (i.e., reports produced after some time) are generally consistent with concurrent reports (i.e., reports made while a task is performed), although retrospective reports tend to contain fewer details.  Furthermore, Ericsson and Simon provided independent evidence that many kinds of concurrent reports are valid.  In the absence of more specific studies, Ericsson and Simon's findings don't eliminate Schwitzgebel's concern.  But they at least diminish its force.

In the end, Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel converge more substantially than they diverge.  Their message is true and important:  DES is a valuable research technique from which much can be learned; its results can be, and deserve to be, refined and validated.  Their book contains a detailed and nuanced discussion of how to generate and validate data from first-person reports.  It offers a new model of productive interdisciplinary cooperation.  And reading it is a pleasure.  It deserves a wide audience among both psychologists and philosophers.[1]


Chalmers, D. (2004). "How Can We Construct a Science of Consciousness?" The Cognitive Neurosciences III. M. S. Gazzaniga, ed. Cambridge, MA, MIT Press.

Dennett, D. C. (1991). Consciousness Explained. Boston, Little, Brown & Co.

Ericsson, K. A. and Simon, H. A. (1993). Protocol Analysis: Verbal Reports as Data. Cambridge, MA, MIT Press.

Goldman, A. (1997). "Science, Publicity, and Consciousness." Philosophy of Science 64: 525-545.

Piccinini, G. (2003a). "Data from Introspective Reports: Upgrading from Commonsense to Science." Journal of Consciousness Studies 10(9-10): 141-156.

Piccinini, G. (2003b). "Epistemic Divergence and the Publicity of Scientific Methods." Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 34(3): 597-612.

[1] Thanks to Anna Alexandrova, Carl Craver, and Lori Lea Shelley-Piccinini for feedback on a previous draft.