Describing Ourselves: Wittgenstein and Autobiographical Consciousness

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Garry L. Hagberg, Describing Ourselves: Wittgenstein and Autobiographical Consciousness, Oxford UP, 2008, 264pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199234226.

Reviewed by Dale Jacquette, Universität Bern



We describe ourselves when we articulate the condition of our bodies and minds. Since other persons from an external standpoint can often do at least as good a job of characterizing the public facts about us as we can ourselves, it seems to fall to a certain kind of introspective philosophical autobiography to delve into the inner world of first-person psychological experience in the self’s encounters with itself.

Or so we might naturally think from the standpoint of naïve but commonly accepted assumptions about the literature of autobiography as self-descriptive linguistic expression. Such a view of things is typically wedded to a number of substantive philosophical commitments amounting to a metaphysics of the self, of how meaning relates thought to language and the world, and potentially involving a fundamental division of mind and body, of internal and external phenomena. These commitments, powerful as they may seem, are not easily sustained when subjected to the kinds of criticisms Wittgenstein raises in his later posthumous writings, particularly in the Philosophical Investigations and Lectures on Philosophical Psychology. Wittgenstein is frequently seen as challenging the internalist proposition that the self is in a privileged epistemic position to understand its sensations, beliefs, attitudes, judgments, emotions, responses to others and whatever else occurs within a psychological subject’s supposedly impenetrable subjectivity that makes the self uniquely qualified to understand and report on its own immediately lived-through experiences.

Garry L. Hagberg, in this interesting new philosophical study of the literature of autobiography, explores these topics in relation to the mind’s efforts to understand itself reflexively and to share the information with others. The book develops three major themes: (1) the nature of autobiographical thinking, self-investigation, memory, recollection, and writing about one’s self from the standpoint of an attitude that Hagberg calls autobiographical consciousness; (2) the concept of the self implied or presupposed by autobiographical practices as contrasted with Hagberg’s references to the dualistic ‘Cartesian legacy’; (3) Wittgenstein’s philosophical remarks especially in the later period as they relate both positively and negatively to the concept of self and the philosophical understanding of autobiography as self-discovery, self-exploration, and, as Hagberg’s title indicates, self-description. In the course of considering these topics, Hagberg discusses, in fine, such autobiographical classics as Augustine’s Confessions and Fyodor Dostoyevsky’s Notes from Underground, as well as literary and artistic self-portraits by Johann Wolfgang von Goethe, Leonardo da Vinci, Rembrandt van Rijn, Vladimir Nabakov, along with related reflections on the self and the art of autobiography by Arthur Schopenhauer, Søren Kierkegaard, Iris Murdoch, Stanley Cavell, Donald Davidson, and, of course, with special focus throughout, Wittgenstein.

Although I share much of Hagberg’s enthusiasm for his topic, there are a number of things about his project that I do not understand, both on its own terms in explaining autobiography as self-description, and more especially in relation to Wittgenstein’s writings. At a number of crucial junctures I had the sense that Hagberg was leaving unaddressed important points that bear directly on whether his concept of autobiography as describing ourselves could be rightly attributed to Wittgenstein, especially in the early period but also in the later philosophy, and I was not generally satisfied with the interpretation of many passages from Wittgenstein’s texts that Hagberg explicitly cites. I think that in some cases he might be able to fill in the gaps, although it would have been worthwhile to have found him doing so here, but in others perhaps not, and so I remain skeptical about some of Hagberg’s most important conclusions.

First, I worry that Hagberg does not consider a crucially important historical background question as to whether Wittgenstein in the early period could have countenanced a philosophical characterization of autobiography as self-description, the description of a self, and what impact if any Wittgenstein’s early reflections on the mind can be seen to have afterward in the later philosophy. The key passages appear in Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, principally 5.541-5.5422 and 5.631-5.641. Here Wittgenstein writes, for example in 5.5421, spinning inferences from his concept of the general form of proposition: “This shows that there is no such thing as the soul — the subject, etc. — as it is conceived in contemporary superficial psychology”(Ogden edition, 1922). Autobiography itself for the early Wittgenstein, like “contemporary superficial psychology”, is evidently an exercise in a special subcategory of the literature of fiction, writing about that which does not exist. Remarkably, Hagberg does not confront these parts of the early Wittgenstein. If, contrary to appearances, Wittgenstein’s observations do not preclude the meaningfulness of autobiography as self-description, it would be important to understand the reason why. The denial of the self would seem effectively to undermine the intelligibility outside of fiction let alone the philosophical value of autobiography as self-description. Maddeningly enough, moreover, Hagberg touches at least briefly and primarily in footnotes on a number of other aspects of Wittgenstein’s early period picture theory of meaning. The question of whether Wittgenstein could be understood as having changed his mind about rejecting the existence of the psychological subject from the early to the later period, or whether the same conception resurfaces in the later Wittgenstein’s so-called private language argument, is thus regrettably unexamined by Hagberg, leaving the reader to wonder whether the later Wittgenstein was in any better position than the early to take the idea of autobiography or self-description more seriously.

Another omission from Hagberg’s study is the problem of understanding Wittgenstein’s own unique philosophical writing style in relation to the work of autobiography. Especially in the later manuscripts, lectures, and collections of remarks, Wittgenstein often seems to be in dialogue with himself or with another self or side of himself as he unravels the philosophical grammar of relevant expressions involved in purportedly philosophical problems and their role in specific language games pragmatically grounded in a form of life. Hagberg in my view both oversimplifies and puts too much weight on the apparent opposition of voices in Philosophical Investigations when he takes up the question as an aside. Thus, he speculates:

And it is precisely the argumentative strategy of moving ever back and forth between the two opposed poles, the philosophical versus the ordinary voice, that gradually erodes, and perhaps ultimately breaks down, the false sense of givenness, the illusory sense of the experientially given obviousness of the metaphysical predicament of self-isolation (59).

I am not sure that I understand all of this, especially the predicament Hagberg mentions. Perhaps what he means is related merely to the direct inaccessibility of another person’s subjectivity, or alternatively perhaps he means what some philosophers of mind have meant by methodological solipsism. Hagberg nevertheless does not tell us enough to warrant an interpretation under which Wittgenstein could be understood as having an argumentative strategy of any kind, let alone one that involves just the two voices he mentions, the ordinary and the philosophical. Insofar as the Cartesian dualistic legacy has any legs in Wittgenstein’s day, to that extent at least some philosophical and ordinary voices on the question of experiential givenness could exactly coincide. How are we responsibly to decide whether Wittgenstein’s own voice is supposed to be the ordinary or the philosophical or neither or both? What arguably represents Wittgenstein’s voice in much of the Investigations might be based in some loose sense on ordinary language usage, as enthusiastic latter day Wittgensteinians have sometimes assumed. But that hardly makes the points Wittgenstein raises against what Wilfrid Sellars was eventually in a similar critique to call the myth of the given — points, as Hagberg might have it, of an ‘ordinary voice’. What Wittgenstein says in the Investigations from a field linguist’s perspective studying natural language is undoubtedly instead distinctively extraordinary. Alternatively, if Hagberg means that Wittgenstein’s is or is at least sometimes the philosophical voice, then such an attribution is difficult to reconcile with Wittgenstein’s own later efforts to distance his thinking from what would ordinarily be recognized as conventional philosophy, and especially his disavowal of philosophical theses that a philosophical voice would presumably try to articulate and defend, attacking opponents of the view, and the like. My impression is that Wittgenstein’s philosophical soliloquies in the later writings are more complex, often involving more than two voices, but all of them distinctively Wittgenstein’s own as he wrestles in his own thought toward an understanding of the rules of philosophical grammar breached by the expression of a conventional philosophical problem.

Hagberg’s discussion naturally gives rise to the question of how we are to understand the concept of autobiography in its most comprehensive terms. We might accordingly ask whether there is any expression of thought in language or art, as in designing and making things generally, that is not genuinely autobiographical? If I report flatly on the weather, for example, I will be doing so from my personal perceptual, epistemic, linguistic, artistic or in other ways expressive perspective, even if, as it happens, the content of my description matches exactly that of other individuals. That I am able to make the report is already a fact about me. That I do so in English or Armenian, in a scientific rather than mythological language, from a certain place and at a certain time, are all truths about me belonging to a complete self-description, that I performatively express as unmistakably in a certain style as if I were to write out these facts of my life in ordinary words as a more conventionally presented autobiographical monograph.

What interests Hagberg in conventional autobiography is its reflection of whatever he means by autobiographical consciousness. At the end of the book, however, I still did not fully understand what he means by this term. Autobiographical consciousness is surely not merely the autobiographer’s being aware of what he or she is doing at the time, writing an autobiography; autobiographical consciousness must be something more than the autobiographer’s consciousness of being an autobiographer, although it is difficult to say what else is supposed to be implied. Nor is autobiographical consciousness good, old-fashioned, unadorned phenomenology, or Hagberg would presumably not have refrained from identifying it as such. Autobiographers can describe themselves without engaging in a phenomenological descriptive psychology at all, simply by recounting the external facts of what they have done and what happened to them. We describe ourselves more interestingly when we effect to describe our selves, and this attitude is undoubtedly part of what Hagberg means by autobiography as self-description. To advance such a concept of autobiography and the autobiographical consciousness unfortunately seems to invoke the internalism-externalism distinction and the epistemic privilege of the internal perspective that Wittgenstein is supposed to have purged. Otherwise, someone else paradoxically could write my autobiography in my place. It is hard to deny that phenomenology and Hagberg’s autobiographical consciousness are different without having a better idea of what Hagberg means by autobiographical consciousness. One senses intuitively that there are bound to be differences, but it would be useful if Hagberg had made the comparison and explained their relation and differences. Hagberg, however, shuns any such discussion, so much so that the word ‘phenomenology’ does not even appear in the book’s index.

The impressive thing about so many conventional autobiographies is that they seem to require and manage to express, if only between the lines, the writer’s awareness of being engaged in a task of describing his or her self. What remains to be distinguished are the kinds of facts that can and cannot enter such descriptions, as well as the question of what exactly constitutes a description, in order for a writing to qualify as self-description and hence as autobiographical in Hagberg’s sense. Can a gesture in a dance be a description? If not, the reason is not obvious. If a gesture can be descriptive, on the other hand, then there seems to be a problem about where to draw the line between the descriptive and nondescriptive in considering a person’s physical and verbal behavior generally. Is there, therefore, anything we can do that cannot be mined for descriptive information, and hence, insofar as what we do expresses facts about ourselves, is there anything we can do that would not be a self-description?

Autobiographical consciousness is something more like the awareness of describing oneself from within. If so, then we must ask whether and if so how autobiographical consciousness is supposed to be different from phenomenology, and how such an enterprise is supposed to be compatible with Wittgenstein’s rejection of the Cartesian legacy of the internal versus external person and the epistemic privilege of reporting on one’s own state of mind. The narrative of lives as told by those who lived them, in the ordinary sense of autobiography, is something less than subjects’ expressing or their writings’ manifesting an autobiographical consciousness, beyond being aware that they are engaged in the act of describing the facts of their lives. That is not asking autobiographers for very much, if they merely need to be aware that they are writing autobiography, and never stray into the realm of what they think or thought at the time about past incidents of their lives.

I think that many readers of Hagberg’s new book are likely to be pleasantly provoked to at least as many fascinating questions as I was concerning the genre of autobiography, the special characteristic state of mind belonging to anyone who undertakes writing an autobiography, and Hagberg’s application of a philosophical concept of self-description to selected autobiographies, all in relation especially with Wittgenstein’s later philosophy. I was intrigued but never fully persuaded by Hagberg’s characterization of autobiography, although I found what he had to say about the individual autobiographies he chooses to discuss remarkably insightful. I was nevertheless troubled, as some of my critical questions might be understood minimally to imply, at never being able to grasp exactly what Hagberg means by his central concept of autobiographical consciousness and how it is supposed to be different from phenomenology in at least the popular sense of involving introspection in the service of descriptive psychology to share one’s mental life with others. There is something peculiar about the autobiographical consciousness that wants to express as much of its subjectivity for public consumption as it is possible to achieve in writing, art or performance. There are moments of such self-revelation in many conventional autobiographies, and there are autobiographers who specialize in various introspective styles of autobiography, although, as Hagberg implicitly acknowledges in admitting a ‘continuum’ of (family resemblant?) autobiographical practices, certainly not all autobiography fits the model (37).

While I have misgivings about several aspects of Hagberg’s project, I think that the virtues of his book endearingly overshadow its defects. The book contains much of philosophical interest, including the difficulties it raises but does not resolve. It is, after all, a first landing on a virtually unexplored and perilous shore. The reader is encouraged accordingly not to let my questions and criticisms interfere with enjoying Hagberg’s marvelous accomplishment, struggling to work out the difficult philosophical connections between Wittgenstein and autobiography as self-description.