Descriptions and Beyond

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Anne Bezuidenhout and Marga Reimer (eds.), Descriptions and Beyond, Oxford University Press, 2004, 668 pp, $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 019927052X.

Reviewed by Gary Ostertag, Nassau Community College


It is now a full century since the publication of "On Denoting", the essay in which Bertrand Russell introduced the theory of descriptions. The current volume, released just in time for the centenary, shows unequivocally that Russell's analysis remains central to philosophy of language and linguistic semantics: the contributors are all major figures, the quality of the essays is quite high overall, and each essay addresses areas of current research. While many of the nineteen chapters explore various consequences of Russell's approach, developing it in novel ways and defending it against various criticisms (some new, some of long standing), others explore alternative treatments. In addition, some essays consider the application of Russell's theory to phenomena Russell himself never addressed -- for example, so-called pronominal descriptions and anaphoric pronouns.


Quite independently of the volume under review, a glance at the recent literature reveals that interest in the theory of descriptions is as strong as ever. This might seem curious to non-specialists; indeed, it's bound occasionally even to puzzle some working in the area. Why, it might be asked, is the proper treatment of sentences of the form (T) 'the F is G' of such signal importance? In answering, it should be said that conveying the importance of the theory of descriptions is best accomplished by considering a question that arises in the volume: whether descriptions are, as Russell thought, devices of quantification, and thus should be grouped together with all, some and no, or whether, as Frege thought, they are singular terms, and thus should be grouped together with proper names and pronouns. A quantified sentence such as 'some boys play chess' is true just in case the intersection of the set of boys and the set of chess players is non-empty; in contrast, a singular-term-containing sentence such as 'Nicholas plays chess' is true just in case Nicholas is in the set of chess players. The former expresses an object-neutral proposition: in specifying its truth conditions we make no reference to a particular individual or set of individuals. In contrast, the latter expresses a singular, or object-dependent, proposition: in specifying its truth conditions we must refer to a particular individual.

On Russell's analysis, a sentence exemplifying (T) expresses an object-neutral proposition. The analysis is notoriously unfaithful to surface grammar: for Russell, its logical form is captured by the conjunction: something is F, at most one thing is F, and every F is G. (A similar analysis applies to possessive variants of (T), such as 'her F is G.') Peter Strawson's classic essay "On Referring"[1] argued that this departure from surface grammar gets things exactly wrong: the "rules of use" associated with a sentence exemplifying (T) require that there exists a contextually identifiable F -- something which is both F and which the speaker can be taken to be singling out. In uttering 'the king of France is bald,' for example, the speaker presupposes, and does not assert, that there is such an F. What the speaker does do -- if the presupposition holds -- is to refer to an entity. This is borne out by that fact that, were the speaker (presumably in the dark about France's current form of government) to ask 'is the king of France bald?' he would not be responded to with a flat no. Rather, his presupposition would be addressed: he would be advised that France is no longer a monarchy.

One apparent advantage of Strawson's picture is its fidelity to surface grammar. But this remains an advantage only so long as there are independent reasons to think, with Frege, that definite descriptions are semantical singular terms. Since at least the mid-1970's, linguists have taken descriptions to be quantified noun phrases. More specifically, the definite and indefinite articles have been assimilated into the class of determiners -- items, such as every, some, no and most, that combine with a nominal to form a quantified noun phrase. This line of research inspired those working in philosophical logic and linguistic semantics to construct formal languages containing expressions resembling natural language quantifiers in possessing nominal restrictions. Such a framework not only provided the resources to represent definite descriptions as quantifiers, it did so in a way that captured the truth conditional core of Russell's theory.[2] Of course, even if the definite article is a determiner from the point of view of formal syntax, this doesn't in itself settle any questions about the logical form of sentences exemplifying (T) -- as Russell taught us, grammar may mislead with respect to logical form.[3] Nonetheless, it is now Strawson, and not Russell, who is in the awkward position.

The Russell-Strawson debate concerns a cluster of related issues: logical form and its relation to grammatical form, the difference between object-neutral and object-dependent propositions, the nature and semantic significance of speaker presupposition, the difference between referring to and quantifying over an entity or entities. Evaluating Russell's theory involves taking a stand on these central issues. In addition, taking a stand on one question involves taking (at least provisionally) a stand on the others. Why, then, is the proper treatment of the definite article a continuing object of fascination? Because it will provide an answer to a cluster of fundamental questions in the philosophy of language.

In fact, this list barely scratches the surface. Since Keith Donnellan's essay "Reference and Definite Descriptions"[4] was published, providing the proper treatment of the definite article involves taking a stand on the effect context has on semantic content and, consequently, on where to draw the boundary dividing semantics (roughly, the study of the context-invariant meanings linguistic expressions have) and pragmatics (roughly, the study of the general, language-independent principles guiding the use of linguistic expressions).

The following sections discuss four themes that arise in the volume: the problem of incompleteness, the referential-attributive distinction, presupposition, and the attempt to provide a unified approach to definite and indefinite descriptions. Space considerations force me to discuss of the first two themes (which are in any case intimately related) in a single section and to set aside discussion of indefinite descriptions and unbound anaphora (section V) and descriptive names (section VI).[5]

Incompleteness and the Referential-Attributive Distinction

Donnellan observed that there are two uses to which an utterance exemplifying (T) can be put: it can be used to assert that there is something both uniquely F and G, or it can be used to assert, about a contextually definite individual o, that o is G. For example, one can use 'Smith's murderer is insane' to assert that whoever is uniquely responsible for Smith's death is insane. But one can also use this sentence to assert, of a given woman, that she is insane (e.g., a woman, seen at court, whom I wrongly believe murdered Smith and whose behavior is erratic). While some have taken Donnellan's distinction to provide a serious challenge to Russell, others have denied that it has any direct implications for a Russellian approach. For example, Paul Grice and Saul Kripke early on argued that the distinction in itself admits of a pragmatic explanation.[6] Indeed, Kripke claimed that even in a language in which the definite article is, by stipulation, purely quantificational (so-called Russell English), referential use would nonetheless supervene. These considerations were given definitive treatment in Stephen Neale's landmark Descriptions. Neale observed that, although (1) is quantificational, one can use it to refer to an individual:

1. Everyone attending my seminar showed up.

Context: Smith and I know that Jones is the only student attending Smith's seminar; I ask how Smith's party went last night; Smith responds by uttering (1), thereby conveying the object-dependent proposition that Jones showed up at his party. Obviously, we could, perversely, complicate the semantics of everyone so that, on some uses, it is semantically referential. But this would run afoul of a sound methodological principle, first articulated by Grice: "Do not multiply senses beyond necessity." Grice's principle ("Modified Occam's Razor") cautions against positing ambiguities where appeals to general conversational heuristics are equally explanatorily effective. And these conversational heuristics, as articulated by Grice, provide an effective explanation of how Smith managed to convey a proposition about Jones in uttering (1).

As Grice makes clear, considerations favoring the view that the referential use of definite descriptions is semantically significant equally support the absurd claim that the referential use of everyone is semantically significant. The moral: better to avoid complicating the semantics of the, than either to endorse an absurd hypothesis or arbitrarily treat similar contexts differently.

In his contribution, "The Case for Referential Descriptions", Michael Devitt develops a powerful argument against the Grice-Russell orthodoxy. (The discussion of Devitt's argument in the separate contributions of Devitt, Bach and Neale is a highlight of the volume.) Devitt's discussion focuses on incomplete descriptions, where a definite description 'the F' is incomplete at a context just in case the context contains multiple F's. Devitt notes that we regularly use such contextually incomplete descriptions to refer to a contextually salient entity satisfying (but not uniquely satisfying) the nominal 'F'. While Neale shows that it is possible for a quantifier such as everyone to be used to refer, his account doesn't show how a quantifier can be regularly so used. The seriousness of this concern is highlighted by an example due to Marga Reimer. The verb 'incense' means to 'make angry, enrage; exasperate' (OED); a secondary meaning is to 'suffuse with fragrance'. The current primary meaning clearly derives from metaphorical applications of the term during the period in which it meant simply to 'suffuse with fragrance'. Before the current primary meaning became standardized, the intended metaphorical application could be derived from the literal meaning, supplemented with contextual information and general pragmatic knowledge. Standardization occurred when the metaphorical application achieved sufficient regularity to become conventional. Now suppose that Mary, although a competent speaker of English, has one lacuna in her knowledge: she is ignorant of the primary meaning of 'incense'. Mary can nonetheless easily interpret an utterance of (say) 'his remark incensed the judge' by appealing to the secondary meaning and working out the speaker's intention. Thus what seems an incontrovertibly semantic phenomenon -- that 'incense' means 'make angry, enrage; exasperate' -- is, if we are to follow Grice, best understood as pragmatic. Why, after all, complicate the semantics of 'incense' if we can get by with a single meaning that "explains" both of its uses?

It is clear that Grice's principle, followed to its logical conclusion, leads us to an absurdity in this case, and so must be set aside. Since it is possible for m to be a literal meaning of e even though the use of e to mean m admits of a pragmatic explanation, there should be no obstacle in classifying the referential use of an incomplete description as semantic.

Devitt's own proposal takes a referential use u of (T) to be true at a world w just in case the item referred to in u exists at w and is both F and G at w. Thus, Devitt holds that 'the F' in a referential use of (T) is not directly referential: it contributes more than its referent to the proposition expressed. A similar effect is achieved by Nathan Salmon in his contribution, "The Good, the Bad, and the Ugly," when he suggests that in uttering u

one thereby typically asserts two propositions: the general proposition which is the semantic content of the sentence (this is one's literal assertion); and indirectly (and non-literally), in virtue of the first assertion, also the corresponding singular proposition about the person or object that uniquely satisfies [G], if there is one (245).

While Salmon is quick to add that this applies in the case of "bad" uses as well -- i.e., uses of 'the F' to refer to a non-F -- he doesn't explicitly consider incomplete descriptions.[7]

Devitt's treatment of referentially-used incomplete descriptions is truth-conditionally equivalent to one presented by Stephen Neale in his contribution, "This, That, and the Other". Consider (2), uttered as I observe the celebrated philosopher Ferdinand Pergola, who, exhibiting the effects of over-consumption of alcohol, stumbles to the podium to give a lecture (the example is Stephen Schiffer's). Neale claims that my utterance does not involve a completion on the order of (3),[8] nor does it express the singular proposition (4):

2. The guy's drunk.

3. The guy wearing pink sunglasses is drunk.

4. Pergola is drunk.

Rather, he claims that (2) expresses a proposition containing a Gödelian completion, namely (5):

5. [the x: x is male & x = Pergola] (x is drunk)

-- that is, the male identical to Pergola is drunk.[9] This proposition is true at exactly those worlds at which Pergola exists, is male and is drunk. While Devitt is himself agnostic about (2)'s precise logical form, he does agree with Neale that the proposition expressed by the imagined utterance of (2) is truth-conditionally equivalent to (5).

This happy coincidence should give one pause. Devitt endorses an ambiguity theory, one that denies that Russell's theory applies to all utterances of incomplete descriptions; Neale is a Russellian, who champions the view that Russell's theory applies to all such utterances. If there is a real issue here, how can their proposals coincide? In fact, Neale is both a Russellian and an ambiguity theorist. Where he differs from traditional ambiguity theorists (such as Devitt in earlier papers and Howard Wettstein) is in denying that the referential use of (2) is captured by the singular proposition (4). Rather, he holds that the referential use is captured by a Gödelian completion, as in (5). While this does not depart from Russell as dramatically as the traditional ambiguity theory, it nonetheless raises worries of its own. Presumably, the initial concern posed by the ambiguity theory was not that it challenges the word of Russell, but that it multiplies senses beyond what seems strictly speaking necessary.

Of course, as Neale suggests, there is a question whether we are really multiplying senses here -- whether the fact that certain uses of 'the F' are assigned Gödelian completions constitutes a genuine ambiguity (172-73). An alternative defense of Russell, according to which referentially-used incomplete descriptions receive no special treatment, is provided in Kent Bach's excellent contribution, "Descriptions: Points of Reference". Bach defends an unmodified Russellianism, according to which an actual utterance of (2) will be literally false. Such an approach runs counter to ordinary linguistic intuition; as he nicely puts it, "intuitively, one has no sense that there is any false proposition in the air" (223). Bach claims this can be easily explained: the description's obvious incompleteness leads one to "take it either to be used referentially or with an implicit completion": we never actually process the pure, contextually irrelevant descriptive proposition that constitutes (2)'s literal meaning. Although this response is promising, we are still owed an account of how the description's obvious incompleteness leads us to interpret it referentially or with an implicit completion.

It should be noted that Neale adduces independent evidence for his proposal. For example, he claims (176-182) that Gödelian descriptions are needed to account for contexts in which definite descriptions appear to be bound by antecedent quantifiers.[10] George Wilson has argued that so-called pronominal descriptions provide evidence for the idea that descriptions have a semantically referential function. [11] If a description can be used as a pronoun in serving as (the natural language equivalent of) a bound variable, then it is plausible that it can be used as a pronoun in serving as a device of reference. Neale shows that Gödelian completions provide an explanation of Wilson's data within a Russellian framework. (Francois Recanati's contribution, "Descriptions and Situations" (36-37), also provides an explanation of Wilson's data, but from within an alternative implementation of Russell's theory.)

Ernie Lepore's "The Abuse of Context in Semantics: The Case of Incomplete Definite Descriptions" criticizes a popular approach, briefly considered above, according to which context supplements an utterance containing an incomplete description with a completing property. On Lepore's construal, this approach -- the hidden-indexical theory of descriptions -- claims that an utterance of (6) will be completed by a proposition of the form (7):

6. The table is covered with books.

7. [the x: x table & R(x, α)] (x covered with books)

(where α refers to a contextually salient object and R stands for a contextually salient relation). For example, an instance of (7) would be (8):

8. [the x: x table & In-front-of(x, me)] (x covered with books)

Lepore charges that this strategy overgenerates. An utterance of (6) will give rise to more completions than can plausibly held to exist, one for every salient pair α, R such that exactly one entity at the context satisfies 'x table & R(x, α)'. So far, this is nothing new -- the point is familiar from important papers by Howard Wettstein and Stephen Schiffer.[12] What is new is Lepore's claim that the hidden-indexical theory entails that an utterance of (6) is "multiply ambiguous" (51). Lepore here confuses properties of linguistic types with those of linguistic tokens. According to the hidden-indexical theory, the context-invariant "meaning" assigned to the sentence-type (6) is just the propositional template (7). Perhaps, influenced by Jason Stanley and Zoltan Szabó, Lepore takes the hidden-indexical theory to claim that an utterance of (6) is syntactically incomplete, and that context provides lexical supplementation.[13] But, as Neale's contribution makes abundantly clear, this is hardly the only interpretation of the hidden-indexical theory on the books, and certainly not the most plausible.

Lepore also considers an argument against an alternative implementation of the hidden-indexical theory, according to which the role of context is not to provide a completing property, but to assign individual domains to each quantifier (different versions of this alternative approach are developed in Recanati's essay and in Richard Breheny's "Indefinites and Anaphoric Dependence"). Lepore presents a counterexample to this approach (I have changed his example):

9. Every band member envies the lead singer.

(9) has two readings, depending on which quantifier takes widest scope. Note that, if the description takes narrow scope, its domain will vary with the choice of band member. This can be seen if we represent the implicit domain reference:

10. [every x: x is a band member] ([the y: y sings lead]D (x envies y))

For each value of x, the implicitly referred to domain, D, will be the set of members of x's band.[14] But the alternative reading, where the description takes precedence over the universal quantifier, requires D to refer to a fixed set of individuals (containing exactly one lead singer):

11. [the y: y sings lead]D ([every x: x is a band member] (x envies y))

This seems implausible to Lepore. On his view, the ambiguity in (9) is purely structural. Since the current approach is forced to assign different domains to the description to provide a disambiguation, it fails to reflect the structural intuition.

While the argument has a degree of plausibility, it is worth bearing in mind that we may be mistaken in our assumption that the ambiguity is in fact purely structural. This consideration is especially acute for Lepore, who fails to provide a disambiguation that would meet with his approval and who, curiously, closes his essay with the remark that he "has tried to establish that 'the table' means the table and 'every student' means every student everywhere they occur" (67). This leaves him incapable, it would seem, of explaining the ambiguity in 'every student polished the table' as well as that in (9). In any case, it hardly needs mentioning that more powerful tools than Lepore supplies are in order. And if these tools fail to reveal a structural ambiguity, then that is good evidence against Lepore's intuition.

Presupposition and Truth-Value Gaps

Kai von Fintel's "Would you Believe It? The King of France is Back" considers a problem for Strawsonian approaches. While a contemporary utterance of (1) would appear to be neither true nor false, thus supporting Strawson's presuppositional analysis, an utterance of (2) would appear to have a definite truth value -- namely, false -- thus supporting Russell's theory:

1. The present king of France is bald.

2. Last night my friend went for a drive with the king of France.

These intuitions notwithstanding, von Fintel believes that both sentences presuppose that there exists a king of France.[15] First, they both test positive under the 'Hey, wait a minute' test: an appropriate response to either would be, 'Hey, wait a minute -- I had no idea France was still a monarchy.' In addition, there are data suggesting that the relevant presuppositions "project out" of embeddings. While 'Tonight, Conan O'Brien will interview the mathematician who proved Goldbach's Conjecture' appears false, the following embeddings require the presupposition that someone proved Goldbach's Conjecture:

3. I hope that tonight Conan O'Brien interviews the mathematician who proved Goldbach's Conjecture.

4. If Conan O'Brien interviews the mathematician who proved Goldbach's Conjecture tonight, Conan will have to work the proof into his monologue.

Rather than denying that there is any fact of the matter regarding speaker presupposition, the moral von Fintel (optimistically) draws is simply that truth-value judgments are not in themselves a conclusive test for presupposition possession.

But if, as von Fintel supposes, (2) does presuppose that there exists a king of France, why do speakers regularly judge it to be false? The standard response (due originally to Strawson) has been that an empty singular term t creates a truth-value gap in S only if t is the topic of S. But this thought is quickly scotched by consideration of von Fintel's example (5):

5. I had breakfast with the king of France this morning. He and I both had scrambled eggs.

Although the king of France becomes the topic of the second sentence, the sentence seems clearly false nonetheless, contrary to the response's predictions. Developing ideas of Peter Lasersohn, von Fintel suggests that when faced with potential presupposition-failure, we determine "whether we can assign a truth value independently of our knowledge about the nonexistence of the referent in question" (325). The strategy makes use of a "revision" rule: (very roughly) when faced with a presupposition failure, revise your beliefs (as minimally as possible) so that the presupposition holds; then ask yourself, relative to the revised beliefs, whether the sentence is true or false. Notice that, if we revise our beliefs so that France becomes a monarchy, we still respond with squeamishness or uncertainty regarding (1); but the revision enables us to reject (2) as false. (This can be seen by considering the following even-if conditionals: 'Even if there is a King of France, he's still not bald' (uncertain)/'Even if there is a King of France, my friend still didn't go for a drive with him last night' (false).)

As Van Fintel suggests, this account, for all its virtues, fails to give the correct explanation for our rejection of (6):

6. The king of France is on a state visit to Australia this week.

Most of us reject (6) because we know that there is no king of France -- not because we're so intimately familiar with Australian politics that we know (say) that there were no state visits there last week. Van Fintel's suggested fix concerns a clause in the belief-revision rule. The unmodified rule tells us to delete every proposition from our knowledge-base believed on the basis of our belief that France is not a monarchy. This gives the correct results for (1) and (2), but fails for (3). On the modified strategy, we follow the deletion routine just mentioned, with the proviso that we retain those propositions that can be verified by examining the intrinsic properties of a salient entity (332).

How does this apply to interpreting (6)? We delete those beliefs based on our conviction that France is not a monarchy, with the crucial exception of those beliefs that could (in principle) be determined to be true by examining the relevant Australian governmental institutions. When we evaluate (6), we give priority to the beliefs thereby saved. These, it is suggested, would in themselves give us grounds to reject (6).

While this proposal does seem to capture the mechanism behind our off-the-cuff truth-value judgments, it leaves it a mystery as to why the mechanism exists in the first place. We can still ask why, in cases like (6), the existence of a salient entity whose intrinsic properties could, in different circumstances, settle the question of truth vs. falsity should be at all relevant in these circumstances.

It should be noted that the Russellian is within her rights to appeal to pragmatic presuppositions in explaining the intuitions generated by (1). While the Russellian has a readily available explanation of the falsity intuitions (it falls directly out of her semantics), she can adapt von Fintel's strategy to her own ends, maintaining that while an utterance of (1) will be literally false, it will not be recognized as such because revising our beliefs to accommodate the negated presupposition fails anyway to determine the truth-value of the utterance. This way of proceeding would have the advantage of not singling out non-relativized descriptions -- descriptions not within the scope of an external quantifier -- for special treatment.

In his contribution, Jay David Atlas provides an alternative account of the phenomenon considered by von Fintel. Unlike von Fintel, Atlas accepts the standard response, mentioned above, according to which reference-failure induces squeamishness only when the offending expression is a topic Noun Phrase. He also accepts what he calls "the Strawson-Grice Condition" (SGC):

SGC. If S contains a singular term t, then S presupposes that the referent of t exists only if t is a topic Noun Phrase in S.[16]

He can thus explain why (1) induces squeamishness while (7) is judged false without hesitation:

7. It's the king of France who is bald.

Since 'the king of France' is not the topic of (7), the standard view predicts that squeamishness is not in order for (7). In addition, according to SGC only (1) presupposes the existence of a king of France; (7) does not. (Since von Fintel denies SGC, holding that the existence presupposition obtains regardless of the topicality of t, he thus takes both (1) and (7) to presuppose the existence of a king of France.)

Why isn't 'the king of France' the topic of (7)? The answer appeals to the logical form of cleft sentences generally: 'It is t who (is such that) Φ' gets rendered as: the group of those who (are such that) Φ is identical to t. Unfortunately, the analysis is puzzling, and Atlas spends no time making it plausible (he refers the reader to earlier work conducted with Stephen Levinson). Thus we are left wondering why the transformation from 't is F' ('Q are F') to 'it is t who is F' ('it is Q who are F') doesn't preserve the topic of the original.

How would this proposal apply to von Fintel's example, (6)? Atlas's proposed test for topicality (351) finds 'Australia' and not 'the king of France' to be the topic of (6),[17] correctly predicting a robust falsity judgment among informants.[18] It may well be that a revision of the standard view which drops a na•ve identification of topic Noun Phrase with subject Noun Phrase will serve to explain the relevant phenomena. But before we can accept this claim, two hefty assumptions must be discharged: namely, that Atlas's topicality test is indeed valid (for doubts, see note 17), and that topicalization affects logical form.

Representation of Definites and Indefinites in Semantic Theory

In "Referring Descriptions", Mark Sainsbury argues that definite descriptions are singular terms. Although he disagrees with Russell regarding the logical form of (T), he agrees with the truth-conditional core of Russell's approach.[19] Sainsbury attempts to integrate such a picture into a Davidsonian truth-theory. While the approach is illuminating and should certainly be taken seriously among contemporary Russellians, who favor the idea that the definite article is a determiner, and not a singular-term-forming device, it must be said that it is not completely laid out. One crucial omission concerns relativized descriptions, descriptions bound by an antecedent quantifier (discussed by Neale at 175-76). Consider (1):

1. The daughter of every senator attended the conference.

To sustain the idea that descriptions everywhere are devices of reference, we are forced to say that the description in (1) refers relative to an assignment to the variable bound by the external quantifier. Not only does this seems artificial, Gareth Evans long ago warned that the maneuver would ascribe to referring expressions generally "semantical properties of a type which would allow them to get up to tricks they never in fact get up to."[20] Intuitively, reference is a binary relation between an expression and an individual. To admit descriptions into the class of referring expressions is to take the reference relation to hold between a singular term, a sequence and a referent. This is to ascribe to paradigmatic referring terms such as names and demonstrative pronouns a power that they never exploit.

Building on important recent work by Zoltan Szabó,[21] Peter Ludlow and Gabriel Segal defend a unified approach to definite and indefinite descriptions. On their view, both 'the F is G' and 'an F is G' possess one and the same logical form, namely:

2. [some x: x is F] (x is G)

While there are data favoring such an approach, there are abundant data that appear flatly incompatible with it, data which appear to show that part of what 'the F is G' says is that there is exactly one (contextually definite) F. Using a strategy often deployed in defense of Russell, Ludlow and Segal argue that the implication of uniqueness admits of a Gricean explanation.[22] While an evaluation of this strategy cannot he attempted here, it is worth noting that, in endeavoring to provide a unified account of definite and indefinite descriptions, Ludlow and Segal risk giving up Russell's unified account of singular and plural definite descriptions. As Chomsky first noted, a sentence containing a plural definite description, for example, 'the children are sleeping,' involves both universal and existential quantification, being equivalent to: there are at least two children and all children are sleeping.[23] The unitary theorist thus faces a dilemma: either to deny that plural descriptions have universal force, or to restrict the unification to singular definite and indefinite descriptions. If the former seems insensitive to semantic content, the latter "unification" seems hardly worth the effort.[24]


Although weighing in at a daunting 668 pages, the volume is well organized, the material is often exciting, and the editors have done an impressive job, in their section introductions, of summarizing the main points of the essays. My complaints are minor, but should be mentioned. One is that the index is rather skimpy for a volume of this size. Astonishingly, it doesn't contain proper names, so one can't look up to see who refers to this or that figure. Key topics are either missing altogether ('Descriptions, unitary analyses of') or only partially cited (Neale's extensive discussion of Relevance Theory is missing, as is Breheny's discussion of Situation Theory). Also, the co-indexing is spotty (under 'Uniqueness', we find a sub-heading for 'Informational vs. Semantic', but 'Informational vs. Semantic uniqueness' is not listed as a topic). Since the book is hard to skim (I've tried), this seriously detracts from its value as a research tool. Another complaint concerns coverage: while the volume devotes 300 pages to the referential-attributive distinction and the related problem of incompleteness, free description theory, which is a rich area of current research, is not given extended treatment;[25] nor is Delia Graff's widely discussed recent work, according to which descriptions are predicates.[26]

These cavils aside, anyone interested in definite and indefinite descriptions, reference, quantification, pragmatics, anaphora, dynamic binding and descriptive names will want to have this book and devour as much of it as they can. If you're a philosopher of language, or working in linguistic semantics, or just someone who wants to get up to speed in these areas, that should mean you.[27]

[1] Mind 54 (1950): 320-344. Reprinted in Gary Ostertag (ed.), Definite Descriptions: A Reader (Cambridge: MIT, 1998).

[2] See Stephen Neale, Descriptions (Cambridge: MIT, 1990), Chapter 2.

[3] Of course, it does settle the question about the "Logical Form" or LF of sentences exemplifying (T). But LF is a level a of syntactic representation.

[4] Philosophical Review 75 (1966): 281-304; reprinted in Definite Descriptions: A Reader.

[5] Given my decision not to discuss names, I will also not discuss Almog's important essay "The Proper Form of Semantics", whose primary focus is on Donnellan's treatment of empty names. Almog argues that Donnellan's work (as well as David Kaplan's) provides the basis for an "impossibility result": that ordinary language has no semantics, as traditionally conceived.

[6] In "Vacuous Names" and "Speaker's Reference and Semantic Reference," respectively; both reprinted in Definite Descriptions: A Reader.

[7] His account (which applies to both referential and attributive uses of definite descriptions) is motivated, in part, by so-called pseudo de re propositional attitudes -- de dicto attitude reports that exhibit features of de re reports. Salmon's essay also includes a valuable discussion of Donnellan's account of the referential-attributive distinction, culminating in a rigorous formulation of the distinction in terms of the de re-de dicto distinction; in addition, he provides a powerful critique of Kripke's well-known claim that Donnellan's distinction "generalizes" to include proper names.

[8] For potential difficulties here, see the discussion of Lepore below.

[9] A description is Gödelian just in case its matrix (the predicative material following the colon) takes the form 'x is F & x = α' (where α is either a singular term or a variable). While such descriptions were introduced by Kurt Gödel (hence the label), the germ of the idea is present in Frege's Basic Law VI: a = (ιx)(a = x). For a similar treatment to Neale's, albeit in the context of a Fregean theory of descriptions, see Paul Elbourne, Situations and Individuals (Cambridge: MIT, forthcoming).

[10] Further applications are described in his "Pragmatism and Binding", in Zoltan Szabó (ed.), Semantics vs. Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.

[11] "Reference and Pronominal Descriptions", Journal of Philosophy (1991) 88: 359-87.

[12] In "Demonstrative Reference and Definite Descriptions" and "Descriptions, Indexicals and Belief Reports: Some Dilemmas (But Not The Ones You Expect)," respectively; both reprinted in Definite Descriptions: A Reader.

[13] "On Quantifier Domain Restriction," Mind and Language (2000) 15: 219-261.

[14] Recanati's contribution argues convincingly that domain variables should attach to predicates, not determiners or quantifiers. But the choice doesn't affect the point at issue.

[15] More accurately, von Fintel takes a literal utterance of (2) to be neither true nor false. However, he nonetheless takes (2) to be pragmatically false (false for the purposes of ordinary communicative exchanges) -- and it is this phenomenon, as it arises with non-referring description, that he wishes to explain.

[16] That is, only if t is what S is "about".

[17] The test involves a paraphrase that forces the relevant Noun Phrase into topic position. If the paraphrase is equivalent to the original, then the forced topic, so to speak, is also the topic of the original. The two options for (6) are (6a) and (6b):

(6a) Australia, that's where the king of France is on a state visit to this week.

(6b) The king of France, that's who's on a state visit to Australia this week.

According to Atlas, (6a) is intuitively equivalent to (6), in contrast to (6b), which intuitively is not. However, the intuitions are, it seems, highly context-sensitive. In a situation in which we're concerned not with where it is that (say) Jones is on a state visit to, but rather who it is that is on a state visit to (say) China, 'Jones is on state visit to China' would seem to be best captured by 'Jones, that's who's on state visit to China' and not 'China, that's where Jones is on a state visit to.'

[18] While Atlas and von Fintel would agree on (6), the editors, in their valuable introduction to Section III, point out (313) that there are important cases where they would disagree.

[19] In this regard he follows Tyler Burge, "Truth and Singular Terms," Nožs (1974) 8: 309-25. However, Sainsbury, unlike Burge, maintains that descriptions, although singular terms, possess scope.

[20] The Varieties of Reference (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1982), 56.

[21] "Descriptions and Uniqueness," Philosophical Studies (2000) 101: 29- 57.

[22] Craige Roberts, in her contribution, "Pronouns as Definites", argues similarly that contextual uniqueness is neither semantically encoded nor presupposed by 'the F', although on her view definite descriptions are devices of reference, not existential quantifiers. She maintains that the uniqueness effects commonly exhibited by definite descriptions can be explained pragmatically; see pages 512-15 as well as the more extensive discussion in her "Uniqueness in Definite Noun Phrases," Linguistics and Philosophy 26 (2003): 287-350.

[23] "Questions of Form and Interpretation," Linguistic Analysis (1975) 1:75-109.

[24] It should be mentioned that Ludlow and Segal do briefly consider plural descriptions in a footnote (p. 436, fn. 17). Although they maintain that 'the F's', like 'the F', should be analyzed as some F's, they add that such cases "deserve further study" and "would certainly play a role in future investigations."

[25] It is discussed by both Sainsbury and Almog.

[26] "Descriptions as Predicates," Philosophical Studies (2001) 102: 1-42.

[27] Thanks to Ray Buchanan, Frank Pupa, and Stephen Schiffer for comments.