Desert and Justice

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Serena Olsaretti, (ed.), Desert and Justice, Oxford, 2003, 280pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199259763.

Reviewed by Peter Simpson, City University of New York


This collection of essays originated from a conference on desert and justice held in Cambridge, England, in 2001. The contributors include some significant names in contemporary Anglo-American moral philosophy. Besides Olsaretti herself, who also wrote the Introduction, the essayists are Richard Arneson, Fred Feldman, Thomas Hurka, Shelly Kagan, Owen McLeod, David Miller, Samuel Scheffler, George Sher, Peter Vallentyne, and Jonathan Wolff.

Olsaretti opens the volume with a helpful overview of the question at issue and of the contributions of the several authors with respect to it. She lists as chief among questions relevant to desert and justice, and chief among those dealt with by the contributors, first, that of equality and desert and whether these two are conflicting values or can in any way be combined, and, second, that of comparison and desert and whether in the distributions of shares people should receive what they absolutely or non-comparatively deserve or only what they deserve in comparison with what others get and deserve. So for instance if I absolutely deserve 6 units of some good and you absolutely deserve 12 but there are only 6 units available, should I receive all 6 even though you will thereby receive none, or should I receive 2 and you 4? Or would some other division be just?

As regards desert and equality, it would seem that if egalitarianism is right there can be no place for desert. For our deserts must themselves be either equal or unequal, and if the former they will make no difference (we will each receive what is equal all the same), and if the latter they should make no difference (for whatever runs counter to equality will, eo ipso, be unjust). The only way out of this problem, as the contributors acknowledge, is to adopt some restrictive egalitarianism that, while making equality an important or central part of justice, allows for some exceptions relative to desert. One obvious and popular such exception, discussed in particular by Wolff among several others, is desert based on effort, since this seems to be something in our control while other things, such as inherited wealth or natural talent or luck, are not. The idea that only what is in our control can legitimately count as desert is accepted throughout the book, and leads Sher, for instance, to doubt whether even effort can count (for that, he argues, is not entirely within our control either). But why accept this idea? For instance, is it so obvious that Albert, who never studies, does not deserve the A he gets on an exam and that Sarah, who studies intensely, likewise does not deserve the C she gets on the same exam, just because Albert is so naturally talented he excels without effort and Sarah so naturally untalented she cannot excel even with effort? Moreover, is it so obvious that Albert and Sarah, in being thus graded, are treated unjustly? I fail to see why. Nor can I see why Albert should not also deserve and justly get a higher paying job as a result and Sarah a lower paying one. I can see, indeed, why Sarah might resent Albert for this (or nature or the world) and cry lack of fairness, but I cannot see that her resentment would be just. Rather it would be mean-spirited and so very unjust.

My point is simple enough. Where something is to be handed out according to desert (as grades according to performance on an exam, or jobs according to proven ability), it matters not at all from the point of view of justice whether the desert or its basis is in one’s control. All that matters is whether one has the desert. The fact that this will, in many cases, put chance or birth or inheritance or nature at the bottom of desert is irrelevant. Justice comes too late on the scene for any of these things to weigh with it. Of course, we may, along with Miller in particular as well as Olsaretti, Scheffler, Vallentyne and Wolff, have the desire to alter the effects of chance, inheritance, and so forth, but this will not be a desire for justice—nor indeed a desire for injustice; it will be a desire for something else; most likely it will be a desire for social equality. Only if justice is social equality, and a social equality that flattens out differences traceable to what is not in our control, will this desire be a desire for justice. But we ought to read plenty of Nietzsche before we make that identification or have this desire.

Justice, anyway, is at least twofold, distributive and retributive. Hurka doubts that, if desert is allowed or rejected as relevant to one, it can be disallowed or accepted as relevant to the other. This may be right but one needs a proper account of the differences. Absolute desert and equality would seem to have their place in retributive justice: if I have goods worth $X and you have goods worth $Y and we do a fair exchange, the goods I have after the exchange should remain equal in worth to $X and the goods you have to $Y; otherwise we will not have what we deserve according to the rules of fair exchange. Proportional equality and desert, on the other hand, would seem to have their place in distributive justice. There is nevertheless an oddity here because of the influential claim of Joel Feinberg (much discussed in the book) that desert is non-comparative (if I deserve X then I should get X regardless of what anyone else deserves or gets), while distributive justice is comparative (equals should receive the same as each other, not more or less). Thus desert, on this view, can have nothing to do with distributive justice. Since the contributors to this book are in favor of bringing considerations of desert into questions of distributive justice, they wrestle with Feinberg’s view and look for ways to question or modify it. McLeod seems to me to come nearest the truth here when he argues that while desert might not be comparative, the desert-satisfying power of what is distributed certainly is. So suppose an excellent student absolutely deserves an A but the professor gives mediocre students As as well. Then, in this case, the A grade fails to be appropriate to the excellent student’s desert since it fails to indicate his superiority over the mediocre students. Accordingly we are not forced to say, following Feinberg, that the excellent student is treated justly in the non-comparative way (for he receives the A he deserves) but unjustly in the comparative way (for others who deserve less also receive As). On the contrary, we can say the excellent student is treated unjustly tout court—because the A he receives has been degraded and is no longer the A he deserves.

I think this solution is along the right lines but it does not go far enough. We can instead altogether abandon Feinberg’s view that desert is non-comparative by saying that distributive justice only arises where there is something determinate to distribute in the first place, and that the share that you or I deserve is not absolute but proportional. So if my desert is greater than yours, then I should receive a greater share of the distribution; but how much this greater share actually amounts to will not be determinable independently of what there is to distribute and to whom. In short, justice in distribution is secured if my share is related to my desert as your share is related to your desert. Then I get absolutely what I deserve because I get what I comparatively deserve.

This point (which is as old as Aristotle) rather undermines, I think, a lot of the discussion in these essays. But it also points up a confusion in them about what distributive justice is, as well as about the relevance of comparisons. Grading exams, for instance, seems less a case of distributive than of retributive justice (and the same goes for economics, the main focus of interest in these essays). This is because it is a sort of exchange (as economics is also essentially exchange), and the point of a just exchange is that one should end up with the same after the exchange as one had before it. Retributive justice, or the justice of exchange, presupposes, we may say, a distribution of goods and is not itself a distribution but a way of preserving the values of the distribution that already exists. So, for example, the student gives the professor a completed exam which contains the good of a determinate performance, and the professor gives back the grade that is the good equivalent in worth to that performance. When the professor, therefore, gives mediocre students the same grade as he gives excellent students, he commits injustice because he gives the mediocre students more than they had before the exchange and more than they gave in the exchange. Thereby, of course, he may also wrong the excellent students if, as a result, outsiders judge their A grades to be really equivalent to C grades (because the A grades of the mediocre students look to be thus equivalent). But this element of comparison is, strictly speaking, incidental and comes into play, not because comparison is integral to exchange, but because, in this case (as McLeod pointed out), comparison devalues what is exchanged and equality in the exchange is not preserved. The case would be similar to my lending you a $10 bill and then you returning to me a $10 bill which, because of inflation, is now worth half the $10 bill you originally gave me.

Distributive justice differs from retributive in that there is no numerical equalizing of absolute and pre-existing amounts in the before and after of an exchange. Instead, there is a something to distribute and persons among whom to distribute it, and justice concerns making the respective shares correspond to the respective deserts. Of course, there is going to be a question as to what the correct principle of desert is, but determining that question precedes the determination of the justice of the distribution and is not part of it. For instance, in distributing shares to political office one has first to determine what principle of desert to follow. Will it be wealth, or success in campaigning for votes, or birth, or virtue, or something else? When one has determined that (which is perhaps the most important of political questions), one can then distribute office accordingly. And it matters not here whether the offices available for distribution are great and powerful (because the country to be ruled is great and powerful) or the reverse (because the country to be ruled is small and weak). In other words, unlike in the case of retributive justice, no question of absolute desert (or non-proportional desert) arises. A citizen of a small and weak country does not deserve the office of a great and powerful country just because he is extremely wealthy or virtuous. He only deserves whatever office available in his own country is to his deserts as other offices available in that same country are to the deserts of his fellow citizens.

Failure to pay attention to such facts is one failure in this book. Another is that too many of the essays labor under a certain prejudice or error. I will call it the Rawlsian error (for it appears prominently in Rawls) of materialistic envy. The contributors, like Rawls, have an overriding concern with external and material goods, or with goods that admit of economic calculation (the essays of Kagan and Feldman, in particular, are as much exercises in econometrics as in philosophy). These goods are also identified with living well. So a virtuous man, for instance, is said to be living well if he gets a reward in material goods (identified by Arneson, perhaps humorously, with cakes and ale), and to be living badly if he does not. But it is materialistic to suppose that the virtuous man is not already living well because of his virtue and that his material comforts are more than an external aid or flourish. This is to make virtue an instrument to well-being rather than to be itself well-being. But a concern with economics and with the external and material goods proper to economics when it comes to questions of justice will push one in the direction of thus instrumentalizing virtue. It will also push one in the direction of envying those who, for all kinds of chance reasons, have an excess of these goods (for if these goods are the goods of well-being and also the sphere of justice, why should chance, which has no concern for justice, be allowed to determine their distribution?). It will also push one in the direction of favoring means, typically those of big government (which are the readiest to hand these days and which the contributors to this volume, and notably Wolf, automatically turn to), in order, if possible, to equalize the distribution and so satisfy the envy.

These words may seem harsh, but they merely follow tendencies in the book itself. For, first, the book’s focus on comparative justice (the justice of giving to each what they should have in comparison with what others have), and its accompanying failure properly to distinguish distributive and retributive justice and the place of comparison in each, leads necessarily to asking the question whether, if A has what he non-comparatively deserves but nevertheless has the same as B who comparatively deserves more, B should be raised to a higher level, or A should be reduced to a lower level, or perhaps a bit of both. Suppose, to follow one example in the book, two fisherpersons (sic), Ape and Bee, have contributed, respectively, a quarter and three quarters to a cooperative fishing expedition and 12 fish are caught. Hence Ape deserves 3 fish and Bee 9. But suppose further that Bee can only manage to take home 6 fish, then should Ape take home only 2 fish? Or should he rather take home 3 (his due relative to 12) or 6 (his own 3 and the 3 that Bee cannot manage and must otherwise leave behind to rot)? To suppose that justice could require Ape to take home only 2 in this case, or to suppose that there is any serious question of justice here (as opposed, say, to generosity or fortune), already betrays an envious mind. It cannot be the job of justice to make things needlessly worse for one person so that some tidy balance can be maintained with another person.

Second, since many material benefits in society are the result of factors beyond our control, so that some get more of these benefits and others less regardless of any effort or choice on their part, is it contrary to justice to let this be or does justice require us (or the government) to intervene to produce equality (or at any rate to produce rewards relative to effort and not chance or talent)? The Rawlsian principle of fairness, generally endorsed by this book, requires something like the latter. But why accept that principle? Why should it matter if A is better off than I am, even as a result of luck, especially if I have what I need and have the opportunity (as, with few exceptions, I would in a free market) to improve my lot? Civic friendship, inculcated by education (as advocated by Thomas Jefferson, for instance), would be enough to take care of any unable thus to take care of themselves. If one rejects this alternative and prefers the Rawlsian principle instead, it is not justice or even compassion that is the driving force (no one is deprived in either case), but something else. And that something else is, as far as I can see, the envy that is implicit in Rawls’ Original Position.

But let me not push this point further. Let me just say that, for all the ingenuity on show in this book (and there is plenty of that), the effort seems to me, in the end, misdirected and misplaced. Partisans of Rawlsian fairness might like the book. The rest of us, I fear, will not.