Designing in Ethics

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Jeroen van den Hoven, Seumas Miller, and Thomas Pogge (eds.), Designing in Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 231 pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN: 9780521119467.

Reviewed by Norbert Paulo, University of Graz/University of Salzburg


When I picked up this book for the first time, I didn't have a clear idea what "designing in ethics" is all about. After reading it, I'm still wondering whether it is, as the editors claim, a new development in ethics or merely a mixed-bag of applied ethics and non-ideal social/political philosophy as far as they concern institutional design. The chapters in this book cover a wide range of fields, including rather theoretical criticism of Trolleyology, more practical discussions of microfinance institutions and police corruption, somewhat utopian ideas for large-scale pacifism, and a call for architects to design beautiful buildings. I will briefly outline each chapter in turn, though in a revised order. Since the topics are so diverse, I will focus on the underlying claim that they all exemplify the "design turn" in ethics. In order to do so, we need to know what that design turn is.

As one of the editors, Jeroen van den Hoven, claims in his introduction as well as in his opening chapter, after the "linguistic turn" in early 20th century ethics, the 1970s saw the "applied turn" with the paradigmatic founding of the journal Philosophy and Public Affairs in 1971 as well as landmark publications such as Peter Singer's Animal Liberation (1975) and Tom Beauchamp and James Childress's Principles of Biomedical Ethics (1979), all of which proved to be highly influential both in academia and beyond. "However," van den Hoven tells us, "this applied turn largely consisted in the application of existing theory to given practical problems, and involved primarily a static process of analysis and adjudication in light of pre-existing options." (5) This observation leads van den Hoven to call for the next step in the development of ethics as a discipline, the design turn. In contrast to the largely unimaginative and inflexible applied ethics, doomed to choose between fixed options, all of which might be bad, design ethics actively searches for morally preferable alternatives to the status quo. This is presented as a further development rather than an abandonment of applied ethics.

It's noteworthy that none of the authors argues in any detail for the claim that standard applied ethics really is as unimaginative and uncreative as presupposed in the argument for the design-turn. To me, this characterization of applied ethics is a mere caricature similar to the one MacIntyre offered back in 1984. A closer investigation of standard applied ethics would have been needed to substantiate the claim that a new development is warranted.

A driving force behind this perceived need for a design turn is that the world became more and more complex in past decades. New technologies and the Internet have changed the world in various ways; ever larger networks and global interdependencies have made it very hard to assign individual responsibility:

Much of what we do in the twenty-first century we do not do directly to each other, but almost always by way of technology and via a technological milieu that was designed . . . This . . . shifts the locus of responsibility away from the agent as traditionally conceived and brings into view (1) the design histories of the systems and technological milieu in which agency is staged and (2) the choices and role of design agents in the shaping of choice architectures. (19)

This statement might be too strong -- we mustn't forget domestic violence, sexual harassment etc. -- but the main point is clear: increasingly, human behaviour is shaped by things that have been designed, and that could have been designed differently.

One paradigmatic instance is the design of "choice architectures," such as nudges for healthy dietary options in cafeterias by placing fruits instead of chocolate bars at eye level, or speed bumps to slow down traffic. (24) Another case presented as paradigmatic for the need for design thinking is the use of unrealistic philosophical thought experiments such as the trolley cases: "Engineers and designers often reply to Trolley Cases," van den Hoven writes,

by saying that it is a strange set up and they would never design such a stupid piece of railway infrastructure. They suggest it should have been designed with early warning systems, automated breaking systems, kill switches to prevent the tragic choice situation from arising in the first place. (27)

As he acknowledges, this reaction is a misunderstanding of the thought experiment, for its whole point is to isolate a philosophically interesting dilemmatic situation, however unrealistic it may be. But he takes the engineers' reaction to symbolize the thinking philosophers should adopt.

This thinking is nicely captured in a principle suggested as early as 1980 by Ruth Barcan Marcus (and affirmatively referred to by van den Hoven): "'One ought to act in such a way, that if one ought to do X and one ought to do Y, then one can do both X and Y.'" (27) So, design ethics is meant to avoid moral dilemmas, rather than merely pondering options once one faces a moral dilemma. However, the former means real-life dilemmas, whereas the latter refers to dilemmas in thought experiments. Given this distinction, I wonder which pre-design ethicist would not support this principle. It seems that one can have both an emphasis on dilemma avoidance in real-life cases and valuable discussion of moral dilemmas in thought experiments. In fact, standard pre-design applied ethics does cover both. Norman Daniels' discussion of health care ethics is but one example for the former; Singer's drowning-child thought experiment is an example for the latter. So, if applied ethics does cover both, then design ethics doesn't seem to add anything new in this respect. It might rather be understood as designating a sub-field of applied ethics, which is perfectly legitimate but less revolutionary than talk of a "design turn" (in analogy to the "linguistic turn" and the "applied turn") suggests.

The book also contains a sophisticated discussion of a design approach to moral dilemmas, Ibo van de Poel's chapter "Dealing with Moral Dilemmas through Design." Van de Poel starts from the assumption that many dilemmas occur not on the most abstract levels of morality but at the level of specific moral rules, understood as more concrete instantiations of the abstract moral values or principles. Following Henry Richardson's notion of "specification", van de Poel suggests that many conflicts between specific moral rules can be avoided by reformulating these rules in light of the abstract value and the conflicting rule. The same value can often be realized by different specifications, only some of which will be conflicting (60 ff.). On this basis, van de Poel tries to re-conceptualize moral dilemmas in real life as "ill-structured" problems, i.e. problems which are open-ended and in which the available options are not yet fully known. This, again, deviates significantly from the traditional understanding of philosophical as opposed to real-life moral dilemmas and leaves open the question which implications a discussion of real-life dilemmas might have for philosophical dilemmas, and vice versa.

Here is, in a nutshell, how van de Poel's own suggestion is supposed to work (67 ff.): The "design process" starts with the formulation of the goals one plans to achieve. The next step is the development of design alternatives, together with predictions about the behaviour the alternatives are likely to yield. On the basis of an evaluation of the alternatives, the best alternative is to be determined and implemented. Experience with the implemented design might, in turn, warrant adaptions; it also provides valuable information for future designs processes.

If this sounds rather familiar, you might be acquainted with John Dewey's so-called moral philosophical experiment. Dewey's pragmatistic methodology works in five phases, which contain, inter alia, the formulation of hypotheses (i.e., ends to be achieved), the development of different possible solutions and, finally, the experimental testing of the proposed solutions. This methodology provides for various detours for refinements and corrections. Sure, Dewey does not talk about design. But apart from that, his methodology seems to be very similar to the one van de Poel suggests. There are other methodologies -- balancing or proportionality approaches as used in applied ethics and in legal theory, for example -- which are strikingly similar to the design approach and which are well-known in pre-design applied ethics. What is more, van den Hoven describes the same design process as mirroring Rawlsian reflective equilibrium (29), another methodology well-known and widely used in applied ethics and beyond. Yet both van de Poel and van den Hoven miss out on the opportunity to show what the design approach adds to, or how it deviates from, the methodologies used in pre-design ethics.

In "Designing the Morality of Things: The Ethics of Behaviour-Guiding Technology," Peter-Paul Verbeek reaffirms many of the reasons van den Hoven mentions for design ethics: our surroundings and the things we use already shape our behaviour. So, we better start designing them so that they shape it for the better. Verbeek discusses two problems with this design approach. The first is the "designer fallacy," according to which things might turn out differently from what the designer expected. That is, there might be unintended consequences. (84) The second is the "democratic challenge." It concerns, among other problems, these questions: Who gets to decide which things to design (and how)? Which designs need to be transparent and which don't? (86) These are serious questions the other chapters remain largely silent about, which is surprising given the fact that Richard Thaler and Cass Sunstein's nudging proposal, one of the paradigms of design ethics, provoked a number of very critical responses along the lines of the "democratic challenge." Verbeek at least suggests a framework for how to think about these questions -- "moral mediation" (82) --  but doesn't provide a comprehensive analysis, let alone a solution.

The other chapters do not address the question what design ethics is, or if it is desirable. Most of them are meant to provide examples of design ethics. As I said above, the topics are very diverse, which makes it hard to summarize them. In what follows I merely provide thumbnail images of these individual chapters.

In "Good Governance for the Commons: Design for Legitimacy," Theo A. J. Toonen and Neelke Doorn discuss one instance of the "tragedy of the commons," namely the use of the Dutch Wadden Sea and the larger Wadden area. In a detailed case study, they develop detailed recommendations for a governance system for the Wadden area as a commons.

Dennis F. Thompson's "Designing Responsibility: The Problem of Many Hands in Complex Organizations" is a reprint from 2014 in which he synthesizes much of the work he has done on moral responsibility and the many hands problem. On this basis, he discusses three cases of "organizational failure," as he calls it (39), namely the 9/11 terrorist attacks, the Deepwater Horizon oil spill, and the financial crisis that began in 2007. In all of these cases, Thompson finds failures of individual and collective responsibility as well as in the composition and working of the bodies appointed to investigate them.

In another reprinted chapter, "The Health Impact Fund: Aligning Incentives" (originally published in 2012), Thomas Pogge, who is also a co-editor, outlines the idea to use the HIF in order to increase access to affordable medicine for all, especially for the poor who are badly served by the current funding mechanisms (patents) for pharmaceutical research.

In his "Poverty, Exclusion and the Design of Microfinance Institutions," Tom Sorell discusses the pros and cons of various forms of microfinance arrangements for different markets, with the Grameen Bank, founded in 1983 by Nobel Prize winner Muhammed Yunus, as the paradigm case.

Seumas Miller, another co-editor, contributed two chapters. In "Designing-in-Ethics: A Compulsory Retirement Savings System," he outlines a rather theoretical account of socio-economic institutions and applies it to Australia's superannuation system. In "An Anti-Corruption System for Police Organizations" he discusses two of the main challenges such systems face, namely "police culture," which tends to obstruct anti-corruption measures (182), and "integrity tests" used by internal affairs departments to trap corrupt officers. The latter are morally problematic, for instance, because they might involve deception and the violation of privacy rights. (187)

All of these chapters provide detailed and interesting case studies. However, I don't see why they exemplify a design turn when they can simply be described as instances of standard non-ideal social/political philosophy or applied ethics; the label "design ethics" doesn't seem to add anything significant. Apart from the rather obvious idea that there are better and worse ways in which institutions can achieve their respective aims (and that one can learn from experience), the chapters don't suggest any substantial or methodological similarity that would warrant the design turn. They might well belong to one sub-field of applied ethics or political philosophy, namely one that concerns institutional design. This sub-field, however, doesn't seem to be a new one. Just consider Aristotle's discussion of different constitutions and how well they serve the purpose of the state, Cesare Beccaria's arguments against torture and the death penalty, or John Stuart Mill's instrumental argument for democracy. It seems that all of these would also be examples of design ethics understood as concerning the moral perspective on institutional design.

What is more, two of the chapters don't even belong to design ethics understood as the sub-field of applied ethics that concerns institutional design. The first is "Pacifism: Designing a Moral Defence Force," in which Andrew Alexandra discusses the interesting question of whether the very reasons why states use large sums of money to sustain a military might actually be better achieved by pacifistic means such as non-violent campaigns. In contrast to the previously summarized chapters, this one is not a detailed case study; it remains very abstract and general. Perhaps it's better described as the discussion of a utopia.

The other is Christian Illies and Nicholas Ray's "The Ethical Obligation to Beauty in the Design of Buildings," which takes off from an abstract normative duty and specifies this for the context of architecture. The idea, in a nutshell, is that beauty is one of the basic human needs; architects are in a position to fulfil this need; therefore, they have a duty to do so (i.e., they have to build beautiful buildings) because (many) buildings, in contrast to pictures or chairs, are part of the public sphere and can be seen by everyone. This is an interesting idea, but it has nothing to do with designing in ethics as described by van den Hoven and van de Poel. Nor is there a clear link to the other chapters detailing ideas for the morally desirable design of certain institutions. As far as I see, the only link is the coincidental use of the word "design." Apart from that, it's a good example of standard applied ethics.