Desire and Belief: Introduction to Some Recent Philosophical Debates

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Falk, Arthur, Desire and Belief: Introduction to Some Recent Philosophical Debates, Hamilton Books, 2004, 595pp, $62.00 (pbk), ISBN 0761827153.

Reviewed by Aaron Konopasky, University of New Orleans


General Remarks

In this massive volume, Arthur Falk endeavors to offer "full coverage of [the structure of belief and desire]" (p. xi), a remarkably ambitious goal. The discussion is unified throughout by a continued focus on the nature and existence of relational (de re) beliefs. The (putative) phenomenon is a familiar one: some beliefs seem to be underwritten by a distinctive relation of acquaintance to things, an example being my belief, of that man right there (who happens to be Ortcutt, the world's tallest spy), that he is not a spy. This is in contrast to notional (de dicto) beliefs, which are not so underwritten, such as my belief that the world's tallest spy is a spy (provided I don't have any particular person in mind as the referent of 'the world's tallest spy').

Just some of the conclusions reached by Falk are that relational beliefs exist as distinct from notional ones, that they are worthy candidates for scientific study, that they are not merely relations toward complete singular propositions, and that reports of relational beliefs are elliptical (p. xv). Falk also suggests that several interesting positions deserve more attention than they have gotten in recent years. Examples are that the language of thought contains no predicates (see section Q), and that beliefs are attitudes towards eternal sentences (p.442).

By the author's own admission, the book skirts the line between a textbook and a research monograph. I assume his aim was to combine the advantages of both, so as to appeal to students and experts at the same time. To some extent, Falk is successful. The book shares the advantages of breadth and a friendly style of presentation with the typical textbook, as well as precision and the dedication to addressing all the relevant literature with the typical research monograph.

Unfortunately, it also has some of the disadvantages of both. Most noticeably, there tends to be a lack of depth to the discussion (a bit of a surprise, given the length of the book). At the same time, many of the issues go by so quickly that only those already familiar with them will be able to follow along. This problem is compounded by the fact that the book's citations are often not detailed enough to allow one easily to chase up the relevant sections in other texts. On a slightly different note, organization and clarity are problems as well.

In my opinion, unfortunately, the disadvantages of the book will outweigh the advantages for most readers, perhaps with the exception of the graduate student looking for a bird's-eye-view of the philosophical terrain.


Obviously, I won't be able to present every aspect of the book in detail, due to its length. But I will try to touch on the main points in each of the four parts. I will restrict my more critical comments to Part III, 1st sub-part, which is on representationalism.

Part I

In the first part, Falk takes care of preliminaries, including the introduction of various concepts and their associated terminology (Falk claims that he introduces around ninety (!) technical terms over the course of this section). The discussion is accurate, but, characteristically, goes by rather quickly.

A primary goal of this part is to associate a certain type of belief with a canonical way of reporting that belief. Reports of notional beliefs have that-clauses (e.g. Belia believes that the tallest spy is a spy). If a belief is reported this way, we are to assume that singular terms falling within the scope of the that-clause do not permit substitution or wide-scope existential generalization. On the other hand, relational beliefs have about-positions in addition to that-clauses (e.g. Belia believes about that man [Ortcutt] that he is not a spy). If this is the format used, we are to assume that the term in the about-position does permit substitution and wide-scope existential generalization, and that a singular term cannot be imported into or exported out of the that-clause. Falk admits that he is, to some extent, legislating the ways in which we report beliefs, but argues convincingly that this is not a problem.

Part II

After setting out the basics in Part I, Falk moves on to a more detailed discussion of the semantics of belief ascription sentences in Part II. He does a good job of arguing that relational beliefs about concrete physical objects require causal rapport with those objects. He then relies on the work of Kaplan to reject the "concurrence-plus-rapport" theory of relational belief ascriptions, according to which belief ascription sentences, in the case of de re beliefs, are mere reports of the contents of these beliefs, together with the claim that the believer is in causal rapport with the object referred to in the about-position. If this theory were correct, the argument goes, many of us would have inconsistent beliefs. For I might think that Ralph believes, about Ortcutt, that he is not a spy, and that Ralph believes, about Ortcutt, that he is a spy (where Ralph here thinks of Ortcutt as "that man over there"). But these thoughts of mine, concerning Ralph, commit me to a contradiction as long as I also believe (a) that Ralph is rational, and (b) that whenever a rational someone S believes about f that it is not a G, it is also the case that S does not believe about f that it is a G. And most people do so believe.

As a solution to this problem, in the case of beliefs about concrete material objects, Falk simply takes over Kaplan's analysis of the corresponding belief reports.[1] "Ralph believes, about Ortcutt, that he is a spy" is analyzed as elliptical for "Ralph has adopted a name for Ortcutt, and he believes, about Ortcutt with that name that he is a spy (p. 216, emphasis Falk's)." This blocks the derivation of the contradiction. The fact that the name designates Ortcutt is then explained by the fact that the mental name was adopted as a result of Ralph's being in causal rapport with Ortcutt.

However, Falk suggests revising the theory in two ways. First, he suggests adopting the same analysis for beliefs about abstract objects ("Ramanujan has adopted a name for the number 1729, and he believes, about the number 1729 with that name that it is the smallest number expressible as a sum of two cubes in two different ways") (section O). This obviously requires specifying a different relation between the relevant object and the believer than in the previous case; one cannot be in causal rapport with an abstract object. Falk doesn't have much to say here, except that one must have "expert theoretical knowledge" of the object (p. 297). A serious review of this idea would require more in the way of detail.

Falk's second suggestion is to reject this analysis in the special case of self-locating beliefs about oneself (and in a few other cases). This gives us a way to distinguish between such beliefs, called "de se" (for instance, my belief that I myself live in New Orleans), and beliefs that just happen to be about me, without my necessarily knowing that fact (for instance, my belief that Aaron Konopasky lives in New Orleans, where I have forgotten that 'Aaron Konopasky' is my name). Falk suggests that in the case of beliefs de se, the believer has not adopted any sort of mental name for herself – an incomplete proposition is "directly" attributed to oneself. The correct analysis of "Belia believes about herself, that she herself is dehydrated," then, is "Belia believes about herself, without the aid of any name for herself, that she herself is dehydrated (p.258, emphasis Falk's)."

In addition to giving us a way to mark beliefs de se, the directness of this attribution is also meant to explain the allegedly special role beliefs de se have in causing behavior --if I attribute an incomplete proposition to myself under some name, there is always the possibility that I could be unaware that I am the bearer of that name, and hence fail to act on it. My main comment here is that I would have liked to hear more about how Falk understands direct attribution. Often it sounds as though directly attributed beliefs are dispositions to act, but Falk is adamant that this is the wrong interpretation; he claims that this sort of belief can be used in reasoning (pp. 243-245). Falk seems to suggest that the correct understanding of such beliefs is that they are instantiated by mental representations that contain no reference to oneself (p. 321). Since causal relations between mental representations are typically defined via their formal/syntactic relations, and since the formal/syntactic relations between open formulae are typically undefined, I am particularly interested in how this account might go (see the discussion of Part III below for a more detailed discussion of mental representation).

Part III, 1st Sub-Part (Detailed Review)

Part III concerns the theory of "directed-towardness," which is the theory of how we are able to have attitudes toward (both complete and incomplete) propositions. This amounts to Falk's addressing questions about mental representations, such as whether or not they exist, whether they have the structure of a language, and so on. In the 1st sub-part, Falk addresses representationalist theories.

Part P sets out the basics, explaining the Language of Thought (LOT) Hypothesis, and dividing up the conceptual terrain. Falk also very quickly outlines the standard arguments for and against the LOT Hypothesis, oddly, without evaluating them (p. 327-328). He begins offering his own ideas in Section Q, where he considers the advantages of what he calls the "adverbial" theory over sententialism. In fact, the theory that he considers is not the theory that usually goes under that name; most people use that name to refer to a theory according to which beliefs and desires are not relational at all, but rather monadic. Falk uses the name to refer to a somewhat bizarre theory that mental representations do not contain verbs/predicates, but only names. Falk does not address the traditional adverbial theory at all. For the sake of clarity, I will refer to Falk's position as the "no-verb theory."

In favor of the no-verb theory, Falk offers some rather obscure considerations regarding Wittgenstein's problem of The Unity of the Judgment, which stems from the problem of the Unity of the Proposition. As far as I can tell, the worry is that, if mental representations contained verbs as well as names, there would be no way to "bind" the different elements together, so that they formed a unit. At best, they would end up constituting a list of terms, rather than a sentence.

Falk's solution is illustrated in the following example. Consider the thought that Timmy loves Sue. The corresponding mental representation contains only the names 'Timmy' and 'Sue'. How do we distinguish this mental representation from the one that underlies the thought that Timmy hates Sue? Falk suggests that, corresponding to each relational verb is some sort of neurologically significant relation that holds between the names. A person thinks that Timmy loves Sue just in case she bears the belief relation toward the mental representation that consists in the names 'Timmy' and 'Sue', which stand in the neurologically significant relation that corresponds to the loving relation; no predicates are involved.

I don't see that the Unity of the Judgment is any real problem, at least in this context, as explained by Falk. About 20 years ago there was a very simple programming language that could be used to control the behavior of a "turtle" (in fact it was just a triangle on the screen). This language contained verbs. Had the originators of the turtle problem solved Falk's Problem of the Unity of the Judgment? It seems so; the program was clearly capable of manipulating symbols that contained both verbs and names. The only response I can think of on Falk's behalf is that there are no verbs at the lowest level of this programming language. Everything reduces to 0s and1s, after all. But this shouldn't be a cause for concern, since this lower-level language is clearly implementing the higher-level one, which does contain verbs.

My guess is that Falk has taken the notion of the LOT too literally here. He is imagining that, according to the LOT Hypothesis, there are actual concrete symbols corresponding to predicates (he even uses the word 'concrete' (p. 337)). But this is incorrect (assuming that it even makes sense). According to the standard version of the LOT Hypothesis, complex neurochemical states of the brain can be mapped onto the units of the LOT in such a way that one has the belief that aRb just in case one bears the appropriate computational relation toward the neurochemical state mapped onto the expression 'aRb'. Perhaps this is achieved by mapping the LOT's names onto neurochemical states, and its predicates onto neurochemically significant relations between those states. This would appear to be in compliance with Falk's no-name theory, but it would be a mistake to describe this state of affairs by saying that the language of thought contains no verbs. A sentence of the LOT contains the verb 'R' just in case the relevant names bear whatever relation to each other that is mapped onto 'R'.

Perhaps Falk is asking whether the mapping from neurochemical states to syntactic objects only takes one neurochemical relation as an argument (the concatenation relation), as opposed to multiple relations (one for each relational predicate). But even if this is a real issue, I can't see how the answer to this question would be of any philosophical interest, nor can I see that one could answer it without doing some detailed empirical investigation.

In Section R Falk considers connectionism, the idea that the architecture of the brain is that of a connectionist network, rather than a classical serial processor. In order to explain the position, he uses the example of a connectionist network that recognizes objects on the basis of their features. In this example, associated with each object that can be recognized by the system is a set of features (for instance, Timmy might be associated with the features tall, brown-haired, young-looking, É). Each feature corresponds to a node in the network, so that (ideally) the node has a positive value if and only if the object being observed has that feature. Each full memory of an object is then associated with some stable state of the entire network. Once again, the discussion goes by rather quickly.

The first philosophically interesting suggestion in the section is that names are to be identified with the stable states of a network similar to the one above. Each name in a person's lexicon, then, is represented as a position in the feature-space defined by the network. The name, once tokened, can then be used in other parts of the larger network within which the smaller network appears.

The first thing to notice about this suggestion is that it involves a relatively tame sort of connectionism, in which isolable sub-parts of the entire network can be assigned content. A dyed-in-the-wool connectionist is likely to deny that one could isolate, for instance, the part of the system that means "Timmy." In fact, depending on how the rest of Falk's network is structured, his characterization of it seems fully compatible with its literally being a machine with a classical architecture at a higher level of description (in other words, with the connectionist system's implementing a serial processor). However, we are not given any of those details.

As for Falk's suggestion about names, I am skeptical. It seems plausible that we might recognize someone by way of their features, but identifying names with locations in a feature-space seems to cause problems. Since this appears to be a version of the description theory of reference, Falk must face all the classic problems associated with that theory. There is the obvious problem of names for unobservable things, as well as the problem of inter-personal synonymy (perhaps the features I associate with Timmy are not the features you associate with him). There is also the problem of intra-personal synonymy across time, since I might change my mind about Timmy's features.

The boldest suggestion in the section is that this sort of connectionist theory solves the problem of misrepresentation, which is the problem of how one could ever have a false belief. This is a problem for causal theories of content, according to which an expression in the LOT means whatever sort of thing can cause it to be tokened inside a belief. Consider the mentalese expression meaning "cow." Imagine that it has been tokened inside the mentalese sentence meaning "there is a cow," and that the agent bears the belief relation toward this sentence. Now suppose that the sentence was tokened as a result of the agent's seeing a fat horse. We would like to say that the person has misrepresented the horse as a cow. However, simple versions of the causal theory do not allow one to do this, because according to this sort of theory the mentalese name 'cow' means whatever sort of thing can cause it to be tokened, and we have just said that it can be tokened as a result of seeing a fat horse (and also as a result of seeing a cow). So it appears that the meaning of 'cow', according to this sort of theory, is "cow or fat horse," and so there was no misrepresentation in the situation described above.

S when in fact no actual object has that set of features.

I do not find this satisfying at all. Of course, if the problem of misrepresentation is solved at the lowest level (in this case, at the level of features), then it becomes possible to build more complex representations out of the symbols representing those features in such a way as to allow for misrepresentation. But this is true for any causal theory of content. If the problem of misrepresentation can be solved for the expressions meaning "cow" and "brown," then we can construct a complex expressions that can misrepresent: 'brown cow'. But we have been given no reason to think that the problem of misrepresentation has been solved at the level of features. Mightn't someone mistake brown hair for black?

I don't have much to say about Section S, which is mainly a review of the Putnam/Burge arguments for semantic externalism. Sections T and U discuss the structure of the mental representations that issue directly from the senses.[2] The surprising suggestion is that these representations might have a different structure than other representations in the cognitive system. In particular, it is suggested that these representations have the structure of holophrastic sentences, which are sentences without significant syntactic structure, such as 'Lo, bowl!' (tokened upon seeing a bowl). Other sentences in the system are to have the usual subject-predicate structure typically exploited by LOT theorists. Despite the fact that the causal powers of mental representations are typically explained by way of their syntactic structure, Falk fails to mention how these two types of sentences, with such different syntactic structures, might causally interact.

The support for this suggestion seems to come from Quine's arguments for the indeterminacy of translation. Quine famously argued that it is impossible to tell a person's ontological commitments, and therefore the syntactic structure of their claims about the world (since ontological commitments are encoded into syntax, according to Falk), from facts about their assents and dissents to sentences of a public language.

I fail to see why our inability to tell the syntactic structure of a person's claims about the world has anything to do with the (actual) structure of observation sentences in the LOT. At best, it seems to me that these considerations support the epistemological thesis that we do not know the syntactic structure of a person's observation sentences on the basis of their assents and dissents to sentences of a public language. If this is correct, then perhaps it would be best to treat these sentences as holophrastic, so as not to make unwarranted assumptions about the other person's ontological commitments. This might even be the thesis Falk attributes to Quine; epistemological considerations are not clearly distinguished from metaphysical ones in Falk's exposition.

Anyhow, the whole issue ends up being moot, since Falk eventually dismisses these worries about indeterminacy, along with the holophrasic theory of observation sentences in the LOT (see section U). He argues that we come to know another's ontological commitments by way of empathy; we imagine ourselves in the other's shoes, and ask what we would believe in their situation. We then infer that the other believes as we would, ontological commitments included. This is typically successful, Falk suggests, because people have similar biological make-ups, and therefore similar ontological commitments, due to a common evolutionary history.

Perhaps this sort of theory is correct – a detailed evaluation would take us into the relatively recent literature on mind-reading, a literature that Falk does little more than mention in a footnote or two (pp. 160-161). It should at least be pointed out, however, that adopting the empathy theory (otherwise known as "the simulation theory") is not the only way of allaying worries about indeterminacy. Alternatively, one might say that there are more data available to help uncover a person's ontological commitments than just the person's assents and dissents to sentences of a public language. Perhaps theoretical knowledge from psychology or even folk psychology could help in this regard.

Part III, 2nd Sub-Part

In this section, Falk considers non-representationalist theories, according to which propositional attitudes are not directed toward mental representations, but rather abstract objects like unstructured propositions, structured propositions, and eternal sentences. Organization is a problem here; he considers a myriad of such positions, jumping back and forth with great frequency, making it hard for the reader to follow along. Strangely, he appears to retract his earlier claim that beliefs are directed toward both complete and incomplete propositions, in favor of the theory that they are directed toward both complete and incomplete eternal sentences.

Another difficulty is that, as in his discussion of connectionism, Falk considers a rather tame version of the theory under discussion. Falk's brand of non-representationalism allows that propositional attitudes are instantiated by mental representations, and even that a person's behavior is to be explained on the basis of the syntactic/formal properties of those mental representations. The only non-representationalist aspect of the theory is the claim that propositional attitudes are not directed toward those mental representations, but rather toward their content. He argues for this position by claiming, for instance, that you and I might believe the same thing (e.g. that I like cake), despite having different mental representations underlying our beliefs (e.g., 'You like cake' and 'I like cake' respectively).

Since both representations and contents exist on this view, I'm not quite sure what's supposed to be at stake here. My guess is that Falk is back to questions about the semantics of belief-ascription sentences. Regardless, this is a sort of "non-representationalism" that even a younger Fodor could live with. In fact, he did.

Part IV

I won't say much about the last section of the book, on naturalization. It is here that the problems of the book are most severe – thoroughness and precision have almost completely given way to superficiality and glibness. In the beginning of the section there is a brief discussion of a simple negative feedback mechanism, together with the banal suggestion that minds might well have evolved from such mechanisms. This is followed by a ridiculously breezy and unhelpful discussion of Dennett's work on evolution, followed in turn by an equally unsatisfying rejection of Searle's Chinese Room Argument.

The last 20 pages are devoted to proposing a revolution in analytic philosophy that would be, according to Falk, on par with the Wittgensteinian revolution. It involves a technique called "evolutionary analysis." I'm not at all sure what this is supposed to be, but I think it has to do with coming up with an evolutionary explanation of the origins of various forms of thought. Suffice it to say that the 20 pages are not sufficient to get the revolution completely underway.


The biggest accomplishment of this book is, in Falk's words, to give us "an architecture for housing the many issues [about propositional attitudes] in your mind." For this reason, together with the fact that beginners will have a hard time making it through the book, I believe that it will be most useful to graduate students.

If I had been an editor, I would have suggested dropping the last two parts of the book; the first two parts were by far the strongest (although they contain the least amount of original material). This would have allowed the author to expand in various places, making the book more accessible to advanced students. As it is, the book will be useful to some extent, to some people, although the problems mentioned above are likely to distract considerably.

[1] Falk might not be comfortable with putting it this way – he takes the casual rapport theory of relational beliefs to be a special case of the more general "dominance theory," according to which the referent of a term in the about-position is determined by the way the world is.

[2] Before getting into the details of these sections I should first say that I am much less confident of my interpretation of these and later sections, than I am of the earlier sections -- clarity of exposition begins to suffer at just this point in the book. If any of my criticisms have missed the mark, they should be exchanged for the criticism that the author has failed to make himself clear.