Desire, Practical Reason, and the Good

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Sergio Tenenbaum (ed.), Desire, Practical Reason, and the Good, Oxford University Press, 2010, 251pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195382440.

Reviewed by G. F. Schueler, University of Delaware


The nine papers in this book are focused on the so-called 'guise-of-the-good' thesis, the view, as the editor puts it, "that desire (or perhaps intention, or intentional action) always aims at the good" (p. 3), that is, at something the agent takes to be or conceives of as being good. Over the millennia quite a lot of influential philosophers have accepted versions of this thought. Recognizably similar claims occur in (e.g.) Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Kant, Anscombe and Davidson, to say nothing of the living philosophers both represented and discussed in this book itself. The papers here, which are all of very high quality, are of three sorts. Three papers, by Matthew Evans, Rachel Barney and Jessica Moss, discuss the Platonic (or Socratic) and Aristotelian roots of the guise-of-the-good thesis. Two others, by Kieran Setiya and Philip Clark, either directly argue against it or raise doubts about it. The remaining four papers, by Joseph Raz, Sebastian Rodl, Matthew Boyle and Douglas Lavin, and Sergio Tenenbaum, present explications and defenses of (versions of) this thesis. These four papers arguably constitute the heart of the book.

As several of the authors point out, the guise-of-the-good thesis is not a psychological claim to be confirmed or refuted by examples. It is a conceptual or even metaphysical thesis about action, agency, intention and motivation. On its face it might seem more intuitively plausible if understood as applying only to rational agents, i.e., as saying that 'desire (or perhaps intention or intentional action) of a rational agent always aims at the good.' The defenders of the thesis, in this book at least, seem to think that those extra words are already there implicitly, because at bottom agency, intention and so on are themselves only understandable as features of rational agents. One way this gets expressed by some of the authors is by saying that 'the good' is 'the formal end of practical reason' in the way that 'the true' is the formal end of theoretical reason. Intentional actions 'aim at' the good in the same way beliefs 'aim at' the true. Many of the essays in this book can be read as exploring what this means or as making arguments for (or, in some cases, against) thinking it is so. Given space limitations, I will be able to discuss only a few of the arguments in some of the papers. I will focus on some doubts raised about the thesis and some responses to these doubts.

According to Raz the point of the guise-of-the-good thesis

is that intentional actions are actions we perform because we endorse them in light of what we believe about them, and that means that we must believe that they have features that make them attractive, or as we say, features that give them value. (116)

All intentional actions will involve 'embedded' intentions, by which the agent understands what she is doing, and it is implausible to hold that those embedded intentions themselves must involve valuing. So Raz thinks this means we will have to take the thesis itself in its most general form to involve two claims: "Every intentional action or activity is governed by some independent intention, which determines the content of its embedded intention(s)." And, "Every independent intention involves belief in a reason for the action intended." (121)

The first of these two, though, is false. It is easy to find counter-examples to the claim that desire or action always aims at the apparent good if we focus on cases where there is no independent intention. Raz cites spontaneous actions, such as running one's hand through one's hair, as examples of this. Then too, there are cases such as Gary Watson's of wanting to smash one's squash racquet into the face of the player who just beat you. There seems no reason to think that the rage that gives rise to such a desire (or action) somehow involves the thought that this is a good thing to do. In Raz's view, actions of this sort aren't fully intentional. That means the guise-of-the-good thesis needs to be modified so as to refer only to independent intentions and the actions they govern. And as the rage example shows, it also needs to be modified so as to allow exceptions for less than fully intentional actions. Once these modifications are in place, the thesis, according to Raz, will be that "actions performed with an independent intention are actions performed for reasons, as those are seen by the agents." (122) And this is supposed to entail that, barring ignorance or mistakes, "actions performed with an independent intention are performed in the belief that the action has some value." (125)

Setiya argues that, even understood in a way so as to avoid the sorts of counter-examples just mentioned, the guise-of-the-good thesis is still mistaken. On his view the central issue is about reasons, since there is a difference between a (good) reason for doing something and a person's actual reason for acting, which may or may not be a good reason. The request for her reason for doing what she did can be correctly given by citing something that explains her action but does not justify it, that is, does not aim at anything good. And the agent might perfectly well know this, i.e., that her reason for acting as she does is not a good reason. Someone who acts from bitterness or self-hatred might cite the fact that 'It will ruin things for me' as her reason for acting, without in any way thinking that this justifies doing what she did or somehow argues that it is in any way a good thing. But such a reason, though it doesn't justify her action, makes it understandable. (99)

Responses to this sort of skepticism about the guise-of-the-good thesis are contained (sometimes implicitly) in several of the papers in this book. Raz is one author who addresses it directly. He agrees with Setiya that whenever one acts intentionally "one believes in some explanation of one's action" (127), that it is sufficient to be acting for a reason that one can answer Anscombe's 'why?' question, that "one need not also believe that the reasons for which one is acting are reasons to act in that way", and that the explanation of one's action that one gives need not incline others to think the action was justified. (127) So he agrees that at least some of the explanatory reasons given for an action do not entail that the agent conceives it as good in some way. But, according to Raz, "there must be, for every action performed with an independent intention, at least one explanation that meets an additional condition: It must explain why the agent decided to perform the action, rather than resist the pull toward it." (127) Without this there will be no way to distinguish 'She killed him because she was jealous' or 'She killed him because she felt a sudden rush of rage' from 'She killed him in order to inherit his money'. Only the last of these establishes that the action was intentional and "Setiya's account lacks the resources to distinguish between the first two explanations and the third one." (127)

It is not clear, though, that Raz's point by itself settles the issue. The crucial claim is that some explanation in terms of the agent's reasons "must explain why the agent decided to perform the action, rather than resist the pull toward it" contained in the feeling of rage (or other emotion). And, true enough, the bare point that the agent can answer Anscombe's 'Why?' question by citing an explanatory reason doesn't answer this further question. But unless we just assume that the agent's decision to perform the action rather than resist the 'pull' of this emotion can only be explained by citing something she sees as good about the action, which is just the point at issue, it is not clear that this decision couldn't be made on grounds the agent herself would say do not suggest that the action is worth doing, as e.g., in Setiya's example, "It will ruin things for me." Of course this is hardly a rational ground on which to act but it is hard to see why the agent herself couldn't realize that and still decide to act on just this ground. The fact that in order for the action to be intentional she must have had a ground for her decision to perform it doesn't by itself show that in citing these grounds she must see them as somehow good.

Part of the paper by Boyle and Lavin can be read as a different sort of response to Setiya's challenge. They argue that underlying the question about whether we can answer Anscombe's 'Why?' question by appeal to purely explanatory reasons that do not themselves involve any justifying element is a dispute between two competing conceptions of how actions are explained. The Aristotelian conception that includes the guise-of-the-good doctrine offers explanations of actions that are at bottom teleological. The contemporary (one might say Humean) conception required for the sharp distinction between explaining and justifying reasons rejects teleology and sees action explanations as essentially causal. So Boyle and Lavin offer an argument against the causal conception. According to them, at the heart of the causal theory of action is the idea that "bodily intentional action … consists in (1) a bodily movement (2) caused in some 'right way' by (3) mental states or events of certain specific sorts." (168) And, they claim, it is a "minimal commitment" of any plausible version of such a theory "that the causal antecedents of my intentionally doing A must include a desire to do A." (170)

Since the causal theory is intended as an analysis of the concept of intentional action, "it is crucial to the theory that what it is for an agent to perform an intentional action should be explicable in terms of concepts independent of the concept of intentional action itself." (171) This means that, in the context of this analysis, reference to the object of my desire as 'my desire to do A' won't work as it stands since the phrase 'my doing A' itself describes an intentional action and so can't be used in the analysis on pain of circularity. Boyle and Lavin then argue, at too great a length to be summarized here, that the usual 'propositional attitude' account of the content of desire, where 'S wants to do A' becomes 'S wants that S does A' is simply unsuccessful, in essence because what is intended is one's own performing of the action, rather than just, so to speak, the fact that one does it. If they are right about this then the presuppositions for making the sharp distinction between explaining and justifying reasons, and hence the presuppositions of the skepticism about the guise-of-the-good thesis expressed by Setiya, cannot be maintained.

Even if Boyle and Lavin are right in thinking that explanations of actions must be teleological in the way they claim, however, that only shows that Anscombe's 'Why?' question must be answered by referring to some goal or aim of the action at issue. By itself it doesn't show that what the agent is aiming for might not be, and be conceived by the agent to be, worthless or worse. Even though the guise-of-the-good thesis is part of the Aristotelian conception, it seems a separable part, at least for all this argument shows.

There are other possible grounds for skepticism about the guise-of-the-good thesis. As Sergio Tenenbaum points out in his essay, Aristotle and Kant seem to have understood the thesis in importantly different ways. On a common reading of Aristotle, the end of all actions is "something that is good for the agent" while "Kant certainly holds that the good simpliciter is the object of rational volition" (203). So even if one grants to Boyle and Lavin that actions must be explained teleologically in terms of a goal or goals of the agent, and further grants that this goal must be understood by the agent as good in some sense, it is not clear why it must be understood as 'the good', rather than as merely 'good for me'. If we allow that what is good simpliciter and what is good for me describe irreducibly different evaluative thoughts, then it seems puzzling why the guise-of-the-good thesis, which is about what agents want or what their actions aim for, should apply to 'the good' rather than to 'what is good for me'. So perhaps what actions aim at is what agents conceive of as being good for them, rather than what is good simpliciter.

Moore famously tries to deal with this issue by explaining 'good for' in terms of 'good'. And Aristotle can be thought of as trying a reduction in the other direction, via the thought that only through genuine virtue can one have a successful life. Tenenbaum argues that neither sort of reduction is plausible and makes the interesting suggestion that we should understand 'good for' as describing an appearance of what is good. So the relation between 'good for' and 'good' is that of appearance to reality. An analogy would be the painful and expensive operation someone needs in order to secure her long-term health. Even though she knows that it is better to have the operation than not, the pain and expense make it appear to her that it is worse. Whether or not this suggestion can be made to work seems to depend on explaining what an 'appearance' is in this context. It seems clear in any case, though, that the good-or-good-for issue needs to be solved if the guise-of-the-good thesis is itself to be accepted in the sense most of its defenders want it to have.

This is an impressive collection. No one can seriously read the essays in this book without being struck both by the quality of the reflection that went into writing them and the depth and importance of the topic on which they focus.