Destiny and Deliberation: Essays in Philosophical Theology

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Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Destiny and Deliberation: Essays in Philosophical Theology, Oxford University Press, 2011, 191pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696574.

Reviewed by Bruce Langtry, University of Melbourne


This rich and ingeniously argued book falls into two parts. The first consists of three essays on Hell which together address tensions arising for libertarians who both attach a very high value to free will and also affirm that Hell is a state from which no exit is possible. Kvanvig works with a minimalist core concept of Hell. He treats it as consisting essentially in a state in which people are missing out forever on Heaven, understood as the greatest good possible for persons, involving eternally joyous and loving communion with God. He sets aside the traditional view that Hell involves endless misery, imposed by God as retribution for wrongdoing in one’s earthly life. He wants to address moral objections, which arise even to the instantiation of the core concept.

Nevertheless, the book does not identify with precision what the moral objections to Hell (minimally conceived) are, let alone provide a thorough evaluation of them. The omission is regrettable. For while it is easy to think of formidable moral objections to Hell as traditionally understood, it is harder to construct a strong prima facie moral argument against Hell as minimally conceived. After all, given the core conception, It would, necessarily, be morally wrong for God to cause or allow there to be people in Hell entails the highly disputable proposition It would, necessarily, be morally wrong for God to sustain a person S in existence for a merely finite length of time.

Some theists, called universalists, hold that everyone will participate in the greatest good possible for human beings. Kvanvig argues that universalism fails to deal adequately with the moral objections to Hell. On the one hand, declaring that it is impossible that anyone lives in Hell seems incompatible with anyone's being free to reject Heaven. Unfree participation in Heaven is impossible, since the kind of loving communion with God which is essential to the greatest good possible for human beings cannot be imposed and controlled completely from one side of the relationship. A person who has a blissful afterlife lacking the best possible kind of relationship with God counts as participating in Hell, even if it is a much milder state of affairs than traditionalists have typically envisaged.

On the other hand, Kvanvig argues, universalists would gain nothing by maintaining that, while it is possible that some people end up in Hell, everyone in fact ends up in Heaven. For the moral objections to Hell are objections to there being any possible circumstances in which God would be justified in causing or allowing some people to live in Hell.

Some philosophers try to defend the absence of exits from Hell by maintaining that anyone who inhabits Hell has chosen to do so, and that beyond some point such a choice has become irrevocable;. This is because continual patterns of intentional, God-averse thought and action have gradually become so deeply entrenched that the individual has gradually turned himself/herself into the kind of person for whom it is psychologically impossible to choose to leave Hell. Indeed, we can suppose that everyone who inhabits Hell has freely intended and planned to deprive himself/herself of the freedom to choose to leave Hell. Kvanvig points out various respects in which the foregoing line of thought should be unconvincing. He hopes, however, that the epistemic account of providence developed in the last chapter of his book will enable a revamping of the line of thought he has just sketched.

The second half of Destiny and Deliberation is concerned with the prospects for a libertarian theory of providence which avoids Molinism and yet provides for a universe every detail of whose unfolding has been planned by God.

In Chapter 4, Kvanvig points out that according to Open Theism God's intentions are mutable, e.g., in the light of new reasons for and against specific actions, provided by incoming information about what undetermined events are currently occurring. Therefore, Kvanvig argues, if Open Theism is true, and if there is no subsystem of nature that is immune from intrusion by God's miraculous activity, then God cannot have infallible knowledge of any future events. Surely, however, Kvanvig should recognize that there might be exceptions. For example, a Christian might well suppose that a few moments after the death of Jesus, God could have infallible knowledge that he could acquire no good reason for revising his current intention to raise Jesus from the dead on the third day, and could therefore, a few moments after the death of Jesus, have infallible foreknowledge of Jesus' rising on the third day. I do not see that Kvanvig succeeds in excluding the truth of this supposition.

Chapter 5 is a fictional dialogue between three philosophers about the relationship between God's causal power and the causal powers of created entities, and about how conditionals fit in to the explanation of what happens.

Chapter 6 is a contribution to a debate Kvanvig has been having with Thomas P. Flint about Molinism. Molinists are libertarians who hold that God exercises tight providential control over free human actions by exploiting true counterfactuals of creaturely freedom; their truth, while not brought about by God, is known by God before he creates anything, and is therefore available for his use in planning his creative activity. Kvanvig, however, holds that even if God does not bring about the truth of the conditionals in question, he might still have counterfactual power over their truth. Kvanvig defends his claims against objections by Flint.

Chapter 7 raises further problems concerning the conditionals invoked by Molinism. Are they, for example, subjunctive conditionals? The trouble is that on the usual Stalnaker-Lewis semantic model for subjunctives, God's knowing infallibly which ones are true would require his possessing information about which world is actual. This would involve a kind of circularity: since the truth-value of the conditional depends on which world is actual, it cannot guide God in his deliberation about which world to actualize. Kvanvig examines in detail various other candidate accounts of the relevant conditionals and concludes that none of them provides a satisfactory basis for Molinism.

Chapter 8, 'An Epistemic Theory of Creation', constitutes the book's main positive contribution to the philosophy of divine providence. If it is metaphysically necessary that if God brings a universe into existence then he causally determines all aspects of its history, then God surveys the candidate histories, selects his preferred one, says 'Let it become actual!' and it becomes actual. Complications arise if God is considering, alongside deterministic options, indeterministic options. Kvanvig develops a non-Molinist 'deliberative model' of divine decision-making (though he does not hold that God actually goes through the deliberative process he describes). He aims to show how God might be in a position to exercise precise control of free, undetermined human choices and actions.

Kvanvig identifies the conditionals involved in God's deliberation as 'epistemic' conditionals. He works with the assumption that they have a truth-value, even though he thinks that perhaps a revised version of his theory could dispense with this assumption. He explains (to a first approximation) the meaning of an epistemic conditional φ → ψ by saying that

  1. φ → ψ entails the corresponding material conditional φ ⊃ ψ;
  2. one has updated one's total information state by φ → ψ when the epistemic commitments of adding both φ and ψ to one's total information state are the same as when φ alone is added; and
  3. this is so if and only if (relative to background information) φ provides an adequate reason to conclude that ψ -- a reason good enough to legitimate closure of enquiry concerning ψ

Kvanvig claims that by employing epistemic conditionals, he sidesteps concerns about whether subjunctive conditionals concerning free human actions have truthmakers. Since we frequently have, on the basis of φ adequate reason for believing ψ in cases where ψ states the occurrence of an undetermined event such as a free action, we frequently do have adequate reasons for accepting φ→ ψ in such cases (not merely If φ then probably ψ). This is consistent with the fact that epistemic support is non-monotonic and thus with the fact that there may be some proposition θ, not included in background information, such that even though φ → ψ does not entail (φ & θ) → ψφ & θ is not an adequate reason to conclude that ψ.

The model describes God's deliberation as proceeding in stages: Suppose that I directly bring about (the occurrence of) A and B at time t1. A&B at t1 is adequate evidence for C at t3. So the conditional (A&B)→C is suppositionally true. I can conclude (at t1) that C will occur at t3. But suppose that, having directly brought about A and B at t1, I directly bring about D at t2. This is adequate evidence for the non-occurrence of C and for M at t2, where M is incompatible with C. So the conditional (A&B)→C is not suppositionally true and the conditional (A&B&D)→M is suppositionally true. So I can conclude that M, and not C, will occur at t2. Therefore, since the conditional (A&B)→C has a suppositionally true antecedent and a false consequent, it is false (contrary to what I earlier concluded). And so on. Such a course of suppositional reasoning is complete when, for every contingent proposition p, the supposed divine actions and their outcomes (along with any contingent truths about God which do not depend in any way on any of his creative actions) include either p or else not-p. Each such complete course yields a (total) plan, which consists of what God is considering strongly actualizing, and which generates a complete suppositional story corresponding to a possible world. It provides God with suppositional justifications for all the propositions included in the complete story; and because God knows it is a complete story, he knows that there are no defeaters for the justifications.  Kvanvig does not claim to prove that there are complete suppositional stories, i.e., stories in which there is always an adequate reason for everything which comes later, provided by what comes earlier; he claims merely that it is epistemically possible that there are such stories.

Kvanvig assumes that no truths are inscrutable, and he infers from this that, in general, if a belief is all-things-considered justified and there are no (known or unknown) defeaters for its justification, then it is true. Hence if God in fact directly brings about all and only the states of affairs that a complete suppositional story says he directly brings about, then, even if the story specifies the occurrence of undetermined events such as free human actions, it is plain that (i) the story will certainly be instantiated, and (ii) God will exercise, full, precise providential control over unfolding events, and (iii) God will have full, indefeasible knowledge, at any time following creation, of what future contingents will occur.

Kvanvig uses these results to go further, arguing that if the actual world is one that results from a complete plan then God’s knowledge of the future of this world is infallible, and that the chapter’s epistemic theory of providence is at least compatible with God’s essential omniscience.

Does the theory fulfill its restrained but important aims? Suppose that in the actual world God constructs, at some time t0, a complete suppositional story that specifies the occurrence, at time t10, of such-and-such undetermined events including free human actions. Suppose that God then, at time t1, resolves to bring about all and only the states of affairs that the complete suppositional story says he directly brings about, and that at time t2 he starts implementing his resolution. There is no room in the story for anything to occur which defeats the suppositional justification either for the chronicle of events or for the epistemic conditionals which undergird it. But even assuming that God in fact strongly actualizes all the states of affairs which the story says he strongly actualizes, there is room in the actual world for events to occur which defeat the justification God has at t2 for believing that what in fact happens will not deviate from the story.

Bearing this point in mind, consider the propositions (P) The specified undetermined events will occur at t10 and (Q) There will be no defeaters for the justification of (P). Assume that at t2 God has adequate reasons for believing P. These very same reasons also constitute adequate reasons for his then also believing Q. But neither the truth of Q nor God’s having adequate reasons for believing it establishes that God’s adequate reasons for believing P are indefeasible. According to Kvanvig, ‘grounds are defeasible when it is possible for these grounds to fully justify a given belief and yet that justification be overturned by further learning’ (p.157); presumably he means epistemically possible. For any agent who is aware that adequate reasons for belief are sometimes defeated, the mere possession of adequate reasons for a specific belief does not exclude the epistemic possibility that the belief is false. I can see no way that Kvanvig can rule out its being epistemically possible, relative to the adequate reasons God has at t2 for believing Q, that P is false and that God will, at least by t10 and afterwards, have learned that P is false.

It might be replied: If, in the circumstances under discussion, God’s belief P is false, God has at t2 no way of obtaining evidence that this is so; but this contradicts Kvanvig’s general premise that no truths are inscrutable, a premise which implies that if a person’s belief is justified and yet false then there is some truth of which rational inquirers can in principle become aware and which would thereby undermine the person’s adequate evidence for the belief’s truth.

The reply is mistaken. The general premise does not imply that if a person’s belief is justified and yet false then there is some truth of which rational inquirers can here and now in principle become aware and whose use as a premise would undermine the person’s adequate evidence for the belief’s truth. After all, if scientists are currently justified in believing that no humans will exist 10 billion years from now, and their belief is in fact false, then defeaters for their current reasoning might not become cognitively available in principle until a million years from now. Hence if in the circumstances under discussion, God’s beliefs P and Q are false, the general premise is compatible with the proposition that God at t2 has no way obtaining evidence that P and Q are false.

Chapter 8 argues that if certain general philosophical assumptions, and some assumptions about the nature of God, are true, and if God acts in certain ways, then God has indefeasible knowledge of future undetermined events; additional conclusions late in the chapter depend on this one. I have suggested that the argument provided does not deliver the intended result.

I thank Jonathan Kvanvig for commenting on an earlier version of this review, and thereby stimulating me to improve my treatment of Chapter 8.