Determined: A Science of Life Without Free Will


Robert M. Sapolsky, Determined: A Science of Life Without Free Will,  Penguin Press, 2023, 528pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780525560975.


Reviewed by John Martin Fischer, University of California, Riverside


This is a big, splashy book, both in number of pages and ambitions. It is much ballyhooed, receiving reviews and attention throughout the Anglophone world. Sapolsky wishes to disabuse us of what he takes to be our false beliefs that we are free and morally responsible, and even active agents, three central and foundational aspects of human life and our navigation of it. Much of the book contains summaries (necessarily somewhat brief) of various scientific and mathematical fields (and sub-areas) relevant to his topics: neuroscience (the appendix is a “primer on neuroscience”), chaos theory, quantum mechanics, emergence, and some results from psychology and sociology.

It is a compendious book. The summaries will be helpful in bringing readers up to speed, or at least beginning that process, in a wide variety of disciplines and areas of inquiry. Whereas many in the history of philosophy have contended that all our mental states and behavior are causally determined, a significant feature of this book is to fill in this claim with its specific empirical basis. The view that causal determinism is true is not new, nor is the view that this entails no free will or moral responsibility, but Sapolsky collates and marshals the evidence (some of it recent and cutting-edge) as it bears on these issues. The cumulative effect of the discussions and Sapolsky’s analyses can be an overwhelming sense that we might be wrong about our very foundational beliefs in free will and moral responsibility, and even our selfhood. He writes, “…put all the scientific results together, from all the relevant scientific disciplines, and there’s no room for free will” (8; emphasis in text).[1]

Considered as philosophy, however, the picture is very different. Right off the bat, one is struck by the title. Sapolsky writes, “This book … is both about the science of why there is no free will and the science of how we might best live once we accept that.” (10) But these do not appear to be scientific questions. Science, of course, is relevant; but that does not make free will a scientific question. Note that slavery is beyond a doubt morally wrong. The empirical facts about slavery are relevant, but this does not make the issue of the moral justifiability of slavery a scientific question. How we should adjust our attitudes and behavior in light of a belief in determinism, if we were to acquire such a belief, is definitely not a scientific question.

Surprisingly, in a book about free will, Sapolsky offers no definition of it (or, for that matter, determinism—or even moral responsibility!). He writes, “What is free will? Groan… I’ll do my best to mitigate the drag of this” (14). Although he does not present a full definition proper, it is clear that he holds that free will requires the falsity of determinism—by definition (not as a result of argumentation):

[To establish free will] [s]how me a neuron being a causeless cause in this total sense. …Show me a neuron (or brain) whose generation of a behavior is independent of the sum of its biological past, and for the purposes of this book, you’ve demonstrated free will. (15)

This is problematic in various ways. First, it claims that “being a causeless cause” or “independent of the sum of its biological past” would be sufficient for a choice/action’s being an instance of free will. This is however surely false; pure randomness is incompatible with the control involved in free will. (In his discussion of quantum indeterminacy, Sapolsky is aware of this.) More plausibly, we should interpret him (here and throughout the book) as contending that, as a matter of definition or “meaning,” indeterminism is a necessary condition of free will. Note that the indeterminism of “causeless cause” or “independent of the sum of its biological past” is a very strong kind of indeterminism, leaving out the more appealing idea of not being fully determined by antecedent causes. (Sapolsky elides the distinction between causation and deterministic causation and thus does not consider indeterministic causal accounts of free will).

As Alfred Mele noted, this sets the bar “absurdly high” for a definition of free will, but Sapolsky simply dismisses this worry (15). Mele is clearly correct. It might turn out that one wishes in the end to insist on this indeterministic constraint, but it is problematic to build it into the definition of free will.

Sapolsky also fails to offer a definition of determinism, but one gets the flavor of it, and it is not too different from a standard formulation in philosophical discussions, according to which everything is caused in such a way that the past and the laws entail a unique present and future. This is a metaphysical, not an epistemic point about predictability (as in LaPlace). Much of the book is devoted to establishing that our behavior (choices/formations of intentions and actions) is determined in this sense, and thus not free. Sapolsky holds that this implies we cannot legitimately be held morally responsible for it. He thinks of moral responsibility in terms of the Strawsonian reactive attitudes (Strawson 1962), including indignation and resentment, as well as their “positive” counterparts. He focusses especially on blame and punishment.

Sapolsky sums up his position:

You cannot decide all the sensory stimuli in your environment, your hormone levels this morning, whether something traumatic happened to you in the past, the socioeconomic status of your parents, your fetal environment, your genes, whether your ancestors were farmers or herders. … we are nothing more or less than the cumulative biological and environmental luck, over which we had no control, that has brought us to any moment. (4)

The “nothing more than” claim is not just that we lack free will (and thus moral responsibility), but we are not even agents (in the sense of being active) at all. We do not make genuine decisions and engage in robust practical reasoning. Rather, things just happen to us. Indeed, we are nothing more than a bunch of cells (neurons), determined to bounce around as they do. Importantly, we do not actively change our moral behavior. It does indeed change, but not as a result of active choices on our part (265-299). As Sapolsky puts it, we are not the captains of our ships. (It seems that, on his view, we are not even cabin boys!)

So, we don’t have free will and moral responsibility, but can we live with this? Sapolsky admits it is difficult and he hasn’t entirely succeeded. He sets out, however, in the second half of the book, to argue that we can do it because “we’ve done it before.” What he means, at least in part, is that over the course of human history we have learned more and more about the causes of certain human behaviors. In some cases, such as epilepsy and schizophrenia, as we have discovered their causes, we have stopped holding individuals with these afflictions morally responsible. He believes this supports a general principle to the effect that as we understand the neurobiological (and other) bases of behavior (the ways in which it is determined), we will correspondingly diminish or eliminate moral responsibility for it. As we do so, we become more humane and eschew the dark urges for revenge and the pleasures of witnessing the suffering of others. So far as determinism is indeed true, we can in principle find the causes of all our behavior, in which case we would give up moral responsibility for it, as with epilepsy and schizophrenia. Given this, we should abandon our moral responsibility practices now, even if we do not yet have specific explanations for all kinds of behavior (on the assumption that determinism is true). Sapolsky writes, “…we can subtract responsibility out of our view of aspects of behavior. And this makes the world a better place” (340).

In his concluding chapter, he puts it this way:

…we need to accept the absurdity of hating any person for anything they’ve done; ultimately, that hatred is sadder than hating the sky for storming, hating the earth when it quakes, hating a virus because it’s good at getting into lung cells. This is where science has brought us… (403)

O boy. I cannot possibly engage with all the provocative claims in this book, but I’ll pick a few for special consideration (in addition to the ones I’ve touched on above).

Free Will

Above I pointed out that Sapolsky defines free will as requiring causal indeterminism. He is not alone among neuroscientists in defining free will in this way, but this leads to serious confusions. Much unproductive debate has taken place between neuroscientists and philosophers due to this (often implicit) definition or assumption. The neuroscientists in question believe that establishing that the brain works deterministically implies (without further argumentation) that there is no free will. The philosophers deem this unacceptable, because it rules out compatibilism by definition.

As with Sapolsky, many neuroscientists use the spatial metaphor about “room in the brain.” They seem to think that determinism would entail no gaps, no space in the brain, as though free will has to occupy some gap or space. This is clearly misleading, and, at the least, tilts the discussion away from compatibilism right from the start.[2]

Defining free will in this way evidently begs the question against compatibilism about free will and causal determinism. If this is the correct definition of free will, why bother arguing for incompatibilism at all? It is already there on a beautiful metaphysical silver platter! There are reasonable and plausible arguments for the incompatibility of free will (interpreted in certain specific ways) with determinism, but these arguments are not decided by definitions of the two key notions alone. The history of discussions of free will, including the contemporary debates, is filled with various critiques and defenses of compatibilism. To evaluate these arguments, we need to be clear about what notion of free will is under consideration, and we should consider the arguments carefully. It would be egregiously unhelpful and unfair simply to define compatibilism out of existence from the beginning of the inquiry. Yet this is precisely what Sapolsky does.

Perhaps this is why he offers no arguments in the entire book against compatibilism! He focusses his attention on establishing determinism, but does not seek to refute or in any way argue against compatibilism, where free will is understood in any of a range of ways offered historically and currently. Free will, roughly speaking, is a kind of active power that is typically thought to be necessary for moral responsibility, and that we can grasp inchoately. This power can be analyzed in different ways, some of which are compatibilistic. I can identify no arguments in the book to the effect that any of the prima facie plausible compatibilist accounts of the free will required for responsibility is inadequate; nor do I find an argument that all such accounts must be rejected.

No need to get one’s hands dirty with the tedious business of argumentation! But this does not stop Sapolsky from casting aspersions on compatibilism throughout the book, substituting name-calling for serious philosophical engagement. Here’s just one example:

One compatibilist philosopher after another reassuringly proclaims their belief in material, deterministic modernity… yet somehow, there is still room for free will. As might be kinda clear by now, I think that this doesn’t work [Sapolsky refers to his entire book, chapter by chapter here]. I suspect that most of them know this as well. When you read between the lines, or sometimes even the lines themselves in their writing, a lot of these compatibilists are actually saying that there has to be free will because it would be a total downer otherwise, doing contortions to make an emotional stance seem like an intellectual one (387).

So we compatibilists are lying or perhaps simply deceiving ourselves in a desperate attempt to avoid a “downer”? I (a compatibilist) certainly do not think compatibilism must be true because its falsity would create serious problems in our self-conceptions. I believe it is true because it has various truth-making characteristics that are independent of the desirability of maintaining moral responsibility, even in a deterministic world (Fischer 2023). There are other dismissive animadversions throughout the book. One wonders whether this is the compassion Sapolsky aspires to (and thinks is required by his arguments).

By using the term “free will” in a vague way, and avoiding any consideration of the power it typically is taken to refer to, Sapolsky’s analysis is significantly vitiated. For example, is the freedom in question an alternative-possibilities kind (requiring freedom to choose and do otherwise), or an actual-sequence kind (requiring acting freely, but not necessarily access to alternative possibilities)? In neglecting the inchoate power that is, arguably, the nature of free will, Sapolsky elides (or, at the least, ignores) this distinction in kinds of freedom (a staple of contemporary philosophical discussions of free will and its relationship to moral responsibility.

In taking this path, he cannot specify exactly why determinism threatens (or rules out) free will. It is crucial to acknowledge the distinction between alternative-possibilities and actual-sequence freedom, as the challenges from determinism to the two kinds of freedom are not the same. For instance, causal determinism threatens alternative-possibilities freedom via concerns about the fixity of the past and natural laws (what van Inwagen dubbed the “Consequence Argument” in his [1983]), but it does not thereby threaten actual-sequence freedom. This is not to say that causal determinism does not threaten actual-sequence freedom, but it is not in the same way. Here the worry is that the “source” of the relevant behavior is out of the agent’s control (Fischer 1982; Pereboom 2001 and 2016). The distinction between alternative-possibilities and actual-sequence freedom is important insofar as one’s critique of compatibilism (if one is inclined to offer a critique) would need to depend on the particular version of compatibilism is at issue.

Suppose that a compatibilist denies that moral responsibility requires alternative-possibilities freedom, but only actual-sequence freedom. Now if an incompatibilist worries about causal determinism because she holds that it eliminates alternative-possibilities freedom, this will be irrelevant to the indicated version of compatibilism. On the version of compatibilism I prefer, we do not require freedom to intend or do otherwise for moral responsibility, and thus it wouldn’t matter if causal determinism threatens such freedom. In order to target my preferred sort of compatibilism, the incompatibilist would have to make a different sort of argument, perhaps contending that causal determinism is inconsistent with the required kind of “internality” or “sourcehood.” Thus, it is important to make the distinction between the two kinds of freedom in evaluating arguments for incompatibilism.

There are many sophisticated and prima facie plausible accounts of both kinds of freedom (alternative-possibilities and actual-sequence) on offer in the contemporary philosophical debates about free will. These have prototypes throughout the history of philosophy, some inspired by Hume, some by Kant, some by Reid, and so forth. Some of these accounts are compatibilist, others incompatibilist. One will find no discussions and thus no illumination of these accounts or their historical ancestors in Sapolsky’s book. The entire focus is on whether determinism is true, not its relationship to free will (and its specific variants), where free will is understood (as it must be) as more than simply indeterminsim.

Sapolsky refers to himself as a “hard incompatibilist” (10), a term introduced by Derk Pereboom (2001). This term refers to the view that we almost certainly lack free will (and moral responsibility), whether or not causal determinism is true. As with the compatibilism side of the equation, I find no reflections on indeterministic notions of free will, or a general argument against any of them, in Sapolsky’s book.

Again, the focus is on whether determinism is true, not on whether, in this case, its falsity is compatible with free will. Sapolsky does contend that our free will cannot simply arise from quantum mechanical indeterminacies, but he does not consider approaches, such as Robert Kane’s, that build out from such (purported) indeterminacies in the brain, amplified by chaotic processes, to get a libertarian conception of free will (Kane 1996). There are many other indeterministic strategies for analyzing free will that don’t rest on quantum mechanics or total randomness at any level—event-causal, agent-causal, and non-causal. The proponents of these accounts contend that indeterminism need not imply randomness or lack of control. Sapolsky does not engage with any of them. There are, then, no serious reflections on free will, compatibilist or libertarian, in this book.

Have we really “done this before?” Scientific progress in understanding the neurophysiological bases of various impairments, disorders, and diseases has led to important and salutary changes in our attitudes and responsibility practices. No disagreement here! The problem comes when Sapolsky extrapolates to the general principle that causal understanding implies no responsibility. This is a spurious transition—a hasty generalization of monumental proportions.

We increasingly understand the neurobiology and other causes of various specific conditions, such as epilepsy, schizophrenia, other mental disorders, addictions, and so forth. The conclusion to be drawn is that there are certain kinds of causal histories and conditions that typically or sometimes etiolate or eliminate free will and moral responsibility. It does not follow that all causal factors play the same role, or that we should take this general principle (that understanding eo ipso exculpates) as a working hypothesis. It is important that the underlying physical/causal bases of these specific conditions are different from the bases of ordinary human action in ways that can be identified. These atypical causes are contrasted with what underwrites the distinctive human capacity for practical reasoning, and the contrasts are illuminating and important. We can understand scientifically why these differences from normal functioning lead to the specific syndromes of behaviors associated with each condition, and we thus either withdraw or diminish (say) blameworthiness. We’ve done this before, but it would be inappropriate to leap to the conclusion that any causal explanation of human behavior will be exculpating, simply in virtue of being such an explanation.

We should reject “tout comprendre, c’est tout pardoner.” This is not to say that understanding the background of the individual and the causal history of the behavior should not cause us to mitigate or adjust the level of blame or severity of punishment we attach to it, or that we should not be empathetic. After all, there but for the grace of God (or the luck of the draw), go I. This fact should make us all deeply humble in assigning blame and careful in carrying out punishment. Indeed, there are some kinds of causal sequences leading to behavior that totally exculpate the agent. Here it is not understanding qua understanding that eliminates blameworthiness, but understanding that the causal background is of a certain sort.

Determinism and Trading Places

Sapolsky writes:

Imagine a university graduation ceremony. Almost always moving… The happiness, the pride. The families whose sacrifices now all seem worth it. …

And then you notice someone. Amid the family clusters postceremony… you see the person way in the back, the person who is part of the grounds crew, collecting the garbage from the cans on the perimeter of the event.

Randomly pick any of the graduates. Do some magic so that this garbage collector started life with the graduate’s genes. Likewise for getting the womb in which nine months were spent and the lifelong epigenetic consequences of that. Get the graduate’s childhood as well—one filled with, say, piano lessons and family game nights, instead of, say, threats of going to bed hungry, becoming homeless, or being deported for lack of papers. Let’s [suppose] that, in addition to the garbage collector having gotten all that of the graduate’s past, the graduate would have gotten the garbage collector’s past. Trade every factor over which they had no control, and you will switch who would in the graduation robe and who would be hauling garbage cans. This is what I mean by determinism. (16-17)

This notion of determinism is essentially the metaphysical version of the LaPlacean conception of determinism referred to above. Formative circumstances—the total package—together with the natural laws, entail the choices and behavior of all of us (including the graduate and garbage collector), thus rendering true the claim about what would result from “switching” the formative circumstances. Does such determinism obtain in our world? Sapolsky argues that it does, but it is unclear that he succeeds.

First, a quibble about the thought experiment. If we think of particular individuals as defined in part by their “narratives,” including key features of their formative circumstances, then the garbage collector and the graduate could not trade places in the way envisaged by Sapolsky. The thought-experiment only makes sense if we take a different sort of view of personal identity, according to which the self is some sort of bare subject of consciousness, which is not defined in terms of a particular narrative.

Let this go. A second question is whether the world really works in this way, i.e., whether Sapolsky’s arguments succeed. An evaluation is very difficult, as the elements and their combination require specialized expertise. Some neuroscientists disagree with his conclusions, contending that the brain works in a metaphysically indeterministic way. Some also hold that our brains are indeed the locus, or physical basis, of our free will (and, for that matter, agency). For example, Kevin Mitchell, an associate professor of genetics and neuroscience at Trinity College Dublin, writes:

Our free will is thus not some nebulous, spooky, mystical property granted to us by the gods. It is an evolved biological function that depends on the proper functioning of a distributed set of neural resources.

What are the implications of this position for our views on moral and legal responsibility? … I believe that our views on these issues do not need to change. Despite the headlines proclaiming the death of free will, it remains stubbornly alive and well. Nothing in philosophy or physics or neuroscience or genetics or psychology or neurology or any other science undermines the idea that we do have the capacity for conscious, rational control of our actions.

So there’s no reason, in my view, not to continue to hold people responsible for their behavior…. The broad idea of moral responsibility is … unaffected by discoveries from science that are revealing the neural and cognitive underpinnings of rational control. (Mitchell 2023: 282, 283)

I once attended a graduation ceremony at Stanford University (although not as a professor). Many of my friends in my graduating class were scions of rich and famous people (the owners of the trash-collecting companies, not the trash collectors). Not me. But I did as well as any of them, and there were many more like me. I’m sure many had challenges much larger than mine.

We know that many emerge from challenging circumstances to achieve extraordinary things in all aspects of human life. This suggests that the brain does not work deterministically, as understood by Sapolsky. This suggestion, however, might not survive critical scrutiny, because Sapolsky would insist that we take into account all the formative factors—the total package. The anecdotal evidence does not decide the issue, because it doesn’t (and cannot) do this. It may be that all the formative factors, together with the laws, entail all our choices/formations of intentions and behavior, as Sapolsky contends.

What are we to make of all this? First, to reiterate: it is a scientifically open question whether determinism of the sort Sapolsky defends (or any other kind) actually obtains. There is anecdotal evidence that at least suggests otherwise, and perhaps more importantly, well-regarded neuroscientists disagree. If indeterminism is true, there are various plausible options for analyzing the freedom that would arguably be present, and Sapolsky offers no reasons to reject them.

Second, causal determinism of the sort Sapolsky defends (or some other kind) might obtain in our world. It would be dialectically infelicitous and unproductive at this point simply to dig in one’s heels and claim that it follows straightaway that there is no free will (of any relevant kind). The thought experiment simply brings out a consequence of the truth of a certain kind of causal determinism: switching formative factors (trading places, so to speak) would entail switching outcomes.

Why exactly would this fact about the counterfactuals in question imply no free will (or moral responsibility)? It seems that Sapolsky believes that it, in itself, entails the absence of free will, but, again, this seems to me to be dialectically unhelpful, if not downright question-begging. The question we need to ask is whether the agent (either the garbage collector or graduate) has or exhibits free will of the kind required for moral responsibility along the actual paths they take, and I see no argument in Sapolsky that they don’t. Why exactly does the graduate not have freedom to choose and do otherwise? Why doesn’t he act freely? And why exactly does the garbage collector not possess alternative-possibilities freedom? Why does he lack actual-sequence freedom?

We need to scrutinize the “actual-sequences” that unfold and figure out whether the agent has free will. I do not see why the trading places counterfactuals are relevant to this question (as opposed to that of causal determinism), nor do I find any argument in Sapolsky’s book defending their relevance. It is surely more difficult in various ways for the garbage collector to achieve the feats of the graduate and to behave ethically, but this in itself does not imply lack of responsibility. Formative circumstances of this sort may mitigate (say) blameworthiness and severity of punishment, but not necessarily moral responsibility per se. There are various compatibilist accounts of free will of either the alternative-possibilities or actual-sequence kind, and none is addressed in a serious way by Sapolsky. The presence of the sorts of free will captured by these accounts seem to be consistent with the stories that unfold involving the garbage collector and graduate. One might be dubious about this, or about the plausibility of these accounts, but further illumination is not offered in the book.

Moral Responsibility

Sapolsky doesn’t define moral responsibility, but he gives pride of place to the blaming emotions, such as indignation, resentment, and hatred, and the associated practice of punishment. Like moral responsibility skeptics in general, Sapolsky argues that we do not deserve in a “basic” way (not derived from particular laws or institutions that specify the rules of the social game, so to speak) these attitudes (and, by extension, the positive ones). Punishment, thought of in part as the state’s expression of resentment, is out, in favor of something like the public health “quarantine” model favored by Pereboom (2016).

There are many worries about such an approach, which entirely eshews considerations of moral guilt and desert of proportionate punishment. When a COVID sufferer no longer has the disease, there is no reason to continue to detain him, on the quarantine model. Similarly, when a criminal has been fully rehabilitated (including a recognition of the wrongness of his behavior and a reliable commitment not to do it ever again), there is no reason to continue to detain him, no matter how serious the crime. This is jarring, to my sensibilities, at least. If Putin were apprehended and recanted sincerely (and we believed him), would it be appropriate to let him leave the detention facility? Would it have been so with Hitler?

Sapolsky discusses the trial and detention of Anders Breivik, who gunned down—murdered-sixty-nine teenagers attending a summer camp in Norway. He was found guilty and given the longest sentence possible in Norway (twenty-one years). (379)

He writes:

Breivik was deposited in one of Norway’s dens of [enlightened detention (JMF’s term)]. He has a three-room living space, computer, TV, PlayStation, treadmill, and kitchen (he was able to submit an entry to a prison gingerbread house competition. (379)

And one survivor opined, “If he [Breivik] is deemed not to be dangerous any more after twenty-one years, then he should be released…” 380.

Sapolsky does not contend that all survivors or their families feel the same way, but he finds this Norwegian approach appealing. He points out that the jurors disagreed about the issue of Breivik’s free will, and the basis of the decision had more to do with longstanding Norwegian attitudes toward crime and respect for the humanity of the criminal. Sapolsky himself argues that we are all determined in such a way as to rule out free will and moral responsibility. If that were true, why would one even favor detaining someone for twenty-one years, if he were deemed no longer dangerous? Why detain him at all, after that point is reached? This, despite the individual having (say) gunned down 69 innocent teenagers at a summer camp (or, for that matter, overseen the Holocaust or Russia’s war in the Ukraine).

Sapolsky seems to think the alternative to this sort of health-quarantine model inevitably is in some sense based on, or leads to, ghoulish joy in watching others’ suffering or even being put to death, or at least in knowing that they will suffer. Similarly, Pereboom (whom Sapolsky cites approvingly) contends that punishment based on retribution “comes from” vengeance (in some way that would, in my opinion, need further specification). Sapolsky gives a detailed history of disturbing human practices around cruel punishments and executions. He contends that it is difficult to convince people to abandon the punishment model in favor of the quarantine approach due to “…our enjoyment of seeing righteous punishment served” (370). He adds, “Good luck convincing people that blame and punishment are scientifically and morally bankrupt” (371).

Indisputably, there are excesses and corruptions of the punishment model, but they are not intrinsic to it. One can believe in justified blame and punishment that is proportional to the offense, implemented in ways that are deemed morally acceptable and even humane. Even a retributivist about the justification of punishment (there are various views) need not be a moral monster or indifferent to the awful conditions of penal (or “carceral,” in Foucault’s term) institutions, despite the suggestions of Sapolsky and various of the moral responsibility skeptics. It is a mistake to suppose that there is no middle ground between the quarantine model and one in which people delight in witnessing macabre executions and take ghoulish pleasure in others’ suffering (or accept harsh and inhumane prisons). In applying the reactive attitudes and implementing punishment, we “acquiesce in suffering,” in Peter Strawson’s formulation, but need not delight in it. (Strawson 1962) Insofar as there is free will, deserved blame and punishment are not morally corrupt, and Sapolsky has offered no arguments against free will. It is much likelier that it would be morally corrupt to banish moral responsibility, creating a flatland of the soul, so to speak.

Why exactly are blame and punishment “scientifically corrupt?” Again: free will and moral responsibility are not scientific questions. How best to respond to ill will or norm violations, including the proper response of the state, is a complex moral question with many moving parts. It involves empirical facts but also metaphysical and normative analyses. Science is relevant, but by no means dispositive.


From my perspective as a philosopher, it is jarring that a book on free will would not discuss free will. Sapolsky spends his energy seeking to establish the truth of causal determinism but does not investigate in any serious way how this would relate to free will and moral responsibility. Like many other neuroscientists who adopt a spatial metaphor and proclaim there is no room for free will in the brain (Sapolsky is late to the party), he assumes that causal determinism is incompatible with free will and moral responsibility, rather than arguing for this contention. Further, he believes that indeterministic sequences don’t underwrite free will either, but he never addresses a range of proposals on offer for indeterministic accounts of free will. His discussions of the putative problems with moral responsibility are shopworn, and he has certainly not established that our world would be better off if we “subtracted” moral responsibility. It is more plausible that it would be a desiccated world—a moral desert. This book, despite all the commotion over it, does not offer anything new or illuminating about free will or moral responsibility.[3]

I pause to observe that Sapolsky writes, “I haven’t believed in free will since adolescence [but presumably not for the empirical reasons he invokes in the book!], and it’s been a moral imperative for me to view human beings without judgment…” (9). He agrees that he has not entirely succeeded, but how exactly could this be a moral imperative, given his theory? He certainly could not legitimately feel any regret, or be blameworthy, for not living up to it. Can we still have morality, and moral imperatives, without free will? Perhaps we could still be criticized from a moral point of view without the reactive attitudes, such as indignation and resentment, and without punishment. It is however difficult to fit morality and its distinctive framework of evaluation within a no-responsibility theory, and Saposlky does not explore this in any depth. If we are morally criticizable for failing to live up to moral principles and imperatives, wouldn’t many of the same putative drawbacks of moral responsibility re-emerge? “Subtracting” moral responsibility is not so easy.

This is what I think is going on, and why the book will reach and move many. Sapolsky is filling in the details of how our behavior is caused (and, in his view, determined). He is, you might say, B.F. Skinner on steroids, or better, on neurobiology. We blithely assume, for the sake of our lofty philosophical ruminations, that causal determinism obtains, but when you actually immerse yourself in the details, you can feel the tug of the view that we do not have free will (and cannot fairly be held morally responsible). Sapolsky is seeking to bring philosophical theorizing down to earth in this way, or at least to ensure we recognize we are standing on a particular kind of ground floor. Neuroscientists and social scientists have been making progress in challenging philosophers to make our theorizing more empirically informed, and Sapolsky takes this many steps further. As he describes the causal mechanisms, the details become vivid. It is not just that we are determined by our past and the laws of nature, but in these specific kinds of ways, laid out in their florid detail.

Sapolsky’s challenge to compatibilists is to explain how we could be free and responsible, given that this is the specific way nature unfolds, the particular way in which we are determined. The recognition of the previously hidden causes of our behavior and functioning of our brains can issue in a sense of helplessness. We’re not the captains of our ships or the cabin-boys; having fallen off the ship, it is as if we are in a small raft in the ocean, being carried along willy nilly by the currents.

The challenge for Sapolsky, however, is to explain why this sense of helplessness is not just an unreflective reaction elicited by his impressive weaving together of the strands that enmesh and propel us forward. How is it not a “framing effect” of dubious rational status, employing Kahneman and Twersky’s term? Can he provide an argument for, or at least an explanation of, the claim that this sort of determination entails no free will or moral responsibility? If not, we simply have an unarticulated and vague unease, the basis of which remains obscure. This is where the book leaves us.

Are the human mechanisms of deliberation and our capacity for reasons-responsiveness incompatible with the way our behavior is caused? Why can’t these freedom-conferring properties be in place and play a role in our unfolding stories, even if we are determined in the way outlined by Sapolsky? I believe that physical determination, even of this sort, does not crowd out reasons-responsiveness, a key element of the freedom implicated in moral responsibility, an actual-sequence kind of freedom. But this is a long story (Fischer 1994 and Fischer and Ravizza 1998).

Recall Sapolsky’s claim that hating someone for his behavior is even sadder than hating the sky for storming. What is genuinely sad, however, is that a serious scholar would blur the distinction between the emanations of Hitler and those of the sky. Sapolsky’s elaborate theorizing has made him blind to the difference between thunder and lightning and Sturm und Drang.


Dennett, Daniel C. Freedom Evolves. New York: Viking.

Fischer, John Martin. (1982). “Responsibility and Control,” The Journal of Philosophy 89: 24-40.

Fischer, John Martin. (1994). The Metaphysics of Free Will: An Essay on Control. Oxford: Blackwell.

Fischer, John Martin and Mark Ravizza. (1998). Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility. (New York: Cambridge University Press).

Fischer, John Martin. (2023). “The Resilience of Moral Responsibility.” In Taylor Cyr, Andrew Law, and Neal Tognazzini, Freedom, Responsibility, and Value: Essays in Honor of John Martin Fischer. (New York: Routledge).

Kane, Robert. (1996). The Significance of Free Will. (New York: Oxford University Press).

Mitchell, Kevin J. (2023). Free Agents: How Evolution Gave Us Free Will. (Princeton: Princeton University Press).

Pereboom, Derk. (2001). Living Without Free Will. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Pereboom, Derk. (2014). Free Will, Agency, and Meaning in Life. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Strawson, P.F. (1962). “Freedom and Resentment,” Proceedings of the British Academy 48: 1-25.

[1] Throughout the book, Sapolsky reiterates, like a mantra, his conclusion that there is no free will. All his arguments would imply, if they work, that everything we do is entirely determined, and thus, on his view, there is no free will. Yet, mysteriously, he writes, “This book has two goals. The first is to convince you that there is no free will, or at least that there is much less [italics in text] than generally assumed when it really matters.” I don’t understand. Why “less”, rather than “none,” and what does it mean to suggest that one has at least some “when it really matters”? Perplexing.

[2] The same spatial metaphor is employed in regard to the self: “if determinism is true, there is no room for the self.” It is as if we need to find space for a ghost in the machine (to use Ryle’s metaphor), at least a physical one. The underlying picture is of the self as homunculus, not fully supervenient on physical events and processes in the brain. But a physicalist/determinist will simply point out that the self is constituted by, or supervenes on, the neural processes in the brain; we don’t need to find a special, separate (first class?) compartment for it.

Must the self disappear in the buzz and confusion of the complex functioning of the events and processes in the brain? Some argue for the disappearing self thesis, but Sapolsky simply asserts it.

[3] Somewhat presumptuously, I believe most philosophers (perhaps the vast majority) would agree with me that Sapolsky leaves all the major free will issues untouched. I have the feeling, however, that most neuroscientists would think that his book addresses them in a serious and sustained way. How to reconcile the two perspectives is a delicate question. It strongly suggests that philosophers are on Venus, and neuroscientists Mars.