Determined by Reasons: A Competence Account of Acting for a Normative Reason

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Susanne Mantel, Determined by Reasons: A Competence Account of Acting for a Normative Reason, Routledge, 2018, 190pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 780815394334.

Reviewed by Rüdiger Bittner, Universität Bielefeld


Susanne Mantel's aim in this book is to understand what it is to act for a normative reason. Assuming with a number of writers that normative reasons typically are facts in the world, not facts about the minds of the agents in question, she parts company with most of these writers by denying that a normative reason, when acted upon, is also a motivating reason. Denying this identity allows her to take up, while committed to the worldly view of reasons, the tradition in action theory which explains acting for reasons by reference to mental states, like beliefs and desires. To be sure, having actions be caused by beliefs and desires, which used to be the orthodox view in this tradition, will not do in her opinion. She is convinced that an account of this kind cannot solve the problem of wayward causal chains, the problem, that is, of beliefs and desires causing behaviour other than in the intended way, causing it behind the agent's back, as it were. Instead she calls on dispositions. Her idea is that an agent's manifesting a disposition to respond appropriately to normatively significant features of the world, to things like Paul's being hungry, is what acting for a normative reason consists in. This disposition, however, is a complex one, as it joins epistemic, volitional and executional competences.

The argument for this conception is divided in two parts. The first lays out the account and argues in addition that it allows for two ways of acting for a normative reason, one through explicit reflection on normative features of the situation, the other without such reflection, just by way of being disposed to respond appropriately to such features. The second part of the book explains how normative reasons are related to motivating ones. After rejecting the arguments that have been given for their identity, Mantel argues positively that they must be different because normative reasons are individuated in a coarse-grained way, whereas motivating reasons, being contents of mental states, are individuated fine-grainedly. The relation between them is correspondence rather than identity: those who act for the normative reason that Paul is hungry are motivated not by the fact that he is, but by the contents of their belief that he is.

A summary like this cannot give a proper impression of the subtlety of Mantel's reasoning, the wide knowledge of the literature she brings to bear on the issues, the lucid exposition, the careful, critical and considerate manner in which she proceeds. Characteristic is the irenic spirit of the book. Yes, there used to be a dispute between those who think that reasons are out there in the world and those who think they are in the mind -- both are right in a way, on Mantel's view, and she explains how. Yes, there used to be a dispute between rationalists and sentimentalists about motivation -- in fact one can, on Mantel's view, come to act either way. It is not that she is covering up existing differences. Rather, her approach allows her to leave these battle-lines behind.

Just because the book is a work of outstanding philosophical craft, it may be helpful to consider a number of critical questions that could be raised. One concerns the distinction between normative and motivating reasons, a distinction that is essential for demarcating the book's topic. Mantel argues against holding them to be identical, but that may be to start out on the wrong foot. The question to ask here is why draw such a distinction in the first place. After all, if people in general don't make this distinction, why do some philosophers?

Mantel introduces the distinction as follows:

Roughly, normative reasons determine what we ought to do, while motivating reasons are the considerations that actually figure in our deliberation or that explain our action. (11)

This is puzzling. On the one hand, if a normative reason like Paul's being hungry is merely a reason for its being the case that, under some circumstances, one ought to give him something to eat, then normative reasons are not even reasons for action, but reasons for things being a certain way, just as the fact that it rained recently is a reason for the street's being wet. On the other hand, if we hold on to saying that normative reasons are the sorts of things for which people sometimes do things, then such reasons may surely also figure in their deliberations; or in cases of people's acting without deliberation from mere habit, they may surely also contribute to explaining what they do. But these two things, figuring in people's deliberations and explaining their doings, were just presented as marks of motivating in contrast to normative reasons. So Mantel's proposal either doesn't even distinguish between two sorts of reasons for action, but only between reasons for action and reasons for things being a certain way, or it fails to mark a difference between motivating and normative reasons for action. Either way the promised distinction will not be forthcoming.

Mantel may reply that this is to overlook the dual role of normative reasons which both determine what we ought to do and are that for which we act when we do what we ought to do. (1) Sometimes, after all, people, though acting for reasons, do not do what they ought to do, so in this case the reason for which they act cannot be normative, it can only be a motivating reason. (11) However, this line of argument assumes that people's doing what they ought to do and for the reason that they ought to do it requires a special kind of reason, a kind of reason those do not have for their actions who do what they ought not to do. It assumes, that is, that moral, or more broadly, normative differences make a difference in the theory of action. Mantel endorses this assumption explicitly (2), but in fact it appears dubious. Paul's being hungry is under some circumstances a normative reason to give him something to eat. But if instead, precisely for the reason that he is hungry, I munch my sandwich right in front of him so as to make him suffer all the more, it will be hardly convincing to say that my reason, though the very same as yours in feeding him, must be of a different kind, a merely motivating reason, because I act as I ought not to act. What has that got to do with what is going on when either you or I act for a reason? Moreover, since Mantel wants normative and motivating reasons to be individuated differently (111), if Paul is, without our knowing it, my friend Peter's son, then if you give him something to eat because he is hungry, you also do it for the reason that my friend's son is hungry. Whereas if I parade my sandwich in front of him, I do that not for the reason that my friend's son is hungry, but only for the reason that Paul is, and again making such a difference does not appear plausible. So the assumption that normative differences are relevant in action theory should be given up. Once it is, this reason for distinguishing between normative and motivating reasons falls away as well, with the result that we may, like ordinary people, just speak of reasons, namely of reasons for doing things.

A second worry concerns Mantel's understanding of action for normative reasons as one's manifesting a disposition to do what normative features of the situation favour (43). The worry is that requiring agents to manifest a disposition in acting for a normative reason may be too demanding: could one not act for a normative reason just once without in any way being disposed to act for similar reasons on similar occasions? Mantel considers the objection and replies that those who act just once for a normative reason of a certain kind may still have a disposition to act in accordance with this kind of reason; the disposition may just be suppressed nearly all the time by other stronger dispositions. (54) This, while true, does not allay the worry, though, for what if the agent does not even have such a hidden disposition, as seems certainly possible? Do we have to say that an agent swayed by a reason of some kind just once, but in no way disposed to repeat the feat should the occasion arise, does not in fact then act for that reason? On Mantel's view we have to say that, her reason being that acting not based on an agent's disposition would be a mere accident in that agent's life. (13) And acting that is based on a disposition is not accidental? Considering that it is largely by accident that we come to have the dispositions we do, this reason for grounding action for normative reasons in agents' dispositions does not appear all that impressive.

Finally one may wonder how much illumination an account of acting for normative reasons provides when built on the agent's disposition to act in accordance with normative features of the situation. Mantel puts a great deal of trust in dispositions, while others are more wary about dispositions' existence and usefulness. Furthermore, it seems everyone (Mantel included) agrees that we do not have a plausible analysis of disposition ascriptions. Leaving these matters aside, though, the present question is how much better we understand what is going on with people who do things for normative reasons when we are told that in doing what they do they manifest a disposition to do what the normative features of the situation, or some kinds of them, recommend that they do. Not all that much, it may be felt, because the disposition is too close to what it is a disposition for to shed light on the latter's occurring. The point is not that the appeal to dispositions and their manifestations is ad hoc in action theory. Mantel is right to insist that dispositions, unlike non-deviant causal chains, are well established both in a commonsense and a philosophical understanding of things; they are not merely invented for a particular theory's sake. (65) The point is that the appeal to dispositions, granted that they are accepted citizens of the world, is not illuminating with regard to the things in which they manifest themselves. After all, what other than manifesting itself can a poor disposition do once a suitable occasion arises? Belief and desire have lots of other things to do, so having them underlie acting for a reason is a bold and, were it true, illuminating claim. To say that to do things for normative reasons is to show oneself competent to respond properly to normative features of the situation seems much less exciting news.

These sketchy remarks need to be developed in more detail; the point here is merely to open the discussion. For this book, technically highly competent, well informed and carefully thought through in every detail, will be profitable to discuss for all those eager to understand action for reasons.