Developing Deontology: New Essays in Ethical Theory

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Brad Hooker (ed.), Developing Deontology: New Essays in Ethical Theory, Wiley-Blackwell, 2012, 124pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781444367940.

Reviewed by Mark LeBar, Ohio University


This book offers the relatively rare case in which the value of the whole is precisely equal to the sum of its parts. The book consists of six independent essays, apparently based on a conference on deontology at the University of Reading in 2010. The essays do not engage each other, nor is there any introduction to them. So the value of the collection just is the value of the individual essays, summed. Fortunately, the cast of contributors is stellar, and the essays are uniformly intelligent and well-argued. The value of the essays to particular readers will likely depend on the readers' interest in their several topics. So I will remark on the essays seriatim.

The first, by Michael Smith, is "Deontological Moral Obligations and Non-Welfarist Agent-Relative Values." Smith intends to discredit the idea that a plausible moral theory should be built on maximizing intrinsic value, where such value is understood as welfarist and agent-neutral. Smith's argument is built on the neo-Humean moral psychology familiar to readers of his work, and is constructed with Smith's characteristic clarity and lucidity.

Smith's foundational concern is that it cannot be the case (as he credits Hume with thinking) that norms for reasoning are purely procedural, in the sense that one may reason correctly whatever the "intrinsic desires" one happens to have. ("Intrinsic desires," unlike "extrinsic desires," are not sensitive to our apprehension of reasons.) Why not? If we could do so, one could (Smith argues) deliberate correctly from (i) one's reasons and (ii) one's intrinsic desires, to contradictory practical conclusions. Thus, a fully rational agent must possess certain intrinsic desires, including the desire that he not undermine his own capacity to believe for reasons, that others not interfere with that capacity, nor he with theirs, and that he help both himself and other rational agents to have the resources essential for believing for reasons. Since any agent must, qua fully rational, have these desires, and (on the view Smith favors) having reasons is a matter of having desires given correct deliberation, Smith arrives at the "conjecture" that each agent has the corresponding moral obligations (10). But these obligations are grounded in agent-relative, not agent-neutral, value (that is, the value to each agent in not interfering with and promoting the requisite rational capacities in himself and other agents). And, since these capacities are not (Smith says) part of one's welfare, our fundamental moral obligations are not welfarist, either.

Needless to say, this last step requires that one have a view of welfare on which the possession and exercise of one's rational capacities are not part of one's welfare. If that seems an implausible conception of welfare (as it does to me), then the non-welfarist part of Smith's argument fails. Does the rest of the argument do better? Once the door is opened to the idea (foreclosed to the Humean) that rationality might require having certain "intrinsic desires," one might wonder whether other desires besides those Smith considers belong on the list, and what kinds of priority relations among them might hold.

In the second paper, "Recalcitrant Pluralism," Phillip Stratton-Lake attempts to secure a form of Rossian deontology resistant to being recast as a form of consequentialism. Basic moral principles, Stratton-Lake argues, must, in good Rossian fashion, be understood as providing plural prima facie moral duties, as contrasted to "duties proper" that occur at the level of specific act recommendations and are warranted by the basic moral principles. Stratton-Lake's argument is directed against an "expanding the good" strategy for absorbing into a consequentialist view any putative counterexample to it. The example Stratton-Lake chooses (borrowed from Rob Shaver, who in turn borrowed it from H.A. Prichard) is of a son torn between rendering vital aid to his father or a stranger. Plausibly, the moral reasons for the son to render aid to his father are stronger than his reasons to aid the stranger, which one might think flies in the face of consequentialist impartiality. But a consequentialist can attribute intrinsic value to a son helping his father in a way, explaining why aiding his father brings about the intrinsically best state of affairs.

Stratton-Lake argues that such a consequentialist strategy depends on an impoverished and implausible understanding of moral reasons. The motivating reason for the son is not (even if he is a morally good person) bringing about the intrinsically best state of affairs: it is rendering aid to his father. This, Stratton-Lake argues, is just because rendering aid to his father is what he has normative reason to do. The production of the most valuable state of affairs plays no part in this story; the value is explained by the duty the son has to the father, rather than the duty being explained by the value. Moreover, the argument is cinched by considering the reasons for resentment the father might have were the son to help the stranger. If the consequentialist expansion story were right, the father might be entitled to disapprove of the son's failing to promote the most valuable state of affairs, but not to resent it (33).

So construed, Stratton-Lake offers us a careful version of the "wrong-kind-of-reasons" objection to consequentialist conceptions of moral responsibility, of a sort that have become familiar in recent years.[1] The value in advancing this line of thought will derive from (i) his careful rehearsal of a conception of the relation between various reasons involved in moral obligation and (ii) his application of those relations to the Rossian framework.

Ralph Wedgwood defends the "doctrine of double effect" (DDE) in the aptly-titled third essay, "Defending Double Effect." This essay involves focusing on the nature of the doctrine, in contrast to other recent defenses of (and attacks on) it, and offering an alternative to a "closeness" strategy for defending it against a certain range of objections. As Wedgwood defends the principle, it maintains that "there is normally a stronger reason against an act if that act has a bad state of affairs . . . as one of its intended effects than if that bad state of affairs is merely one of the act's unintended effects" (35). The principle so specified comports (Wedgwood argues) with a large number of moral intuitions. His explanation for what is going on at bottom is this: reasons against performing a certain action are grounded in, first, the badness of the consequent state of affairs, and second, the degree of "agential involvement" in bringing about that state of affairs (43). "Agential involvement" itself is a compound of two effects: first causal (where Wedgwood wants to distinguish causing from merely failing to prevent), and second intentional (where intending, rather than merely foreseeing, intensifies the reason against the action).

This reference to intention provides Wedgwood a tool for meeting the "closeness" problem. This problem occurs in cases such as Judith Thomson's,[2] where one can prevent a trolley from killing five people by pushing a man off a bridge above in order to collide with the trolley. Wedgwood argues that it is wrong to claim, as some defenders of DDE do, that the intention merely to have the man collide with the trolley is sufficiently "close" to intending to kill him to trigger a prohibition. After all, objectively one does not have to intend the death, merely the collision. Wedgwood's proposed alternative is to rely on a notion of "bad news". The idea is that we are guided by moral generalizations, and being so guided, we form expectations about the kinds of outcomes that would be seen as "bad news." Thus, the "bad news" about a man being pushed to collide with an oncoming trolley is sufficient to indicate that there is strong reason not to do so, even if one does not intend his death.

Wedgwood's device here is ingenious, but in a way it aggravates a concern about the degree to which his project is one in deontology. To the extent the doctrine is conceived in terms of, and largely driven by, reasons to avoid bad states of affairs, it seems amenable to being cast in consequentialist terms. It may thus be vulnerable to "expansive" strategies such as those Stratton-Lake is at pains to frustrate. On the other hand, to the extent it puts a premium on the moral value of intending per se -- to the extent it begins to treat outcomes not merely as states of affairs but as ends of particular moral agents (even if universally so) -- it lends itself to a virtue-ethical understanding. Whether that is a virtue rather than a vice may depend on the perspective of the reader.

The fourth paper, "The Possibility of Consent," is by David Owens. In it he explores the contours of "normative interests" -- interests we have in controlling the rights and obligations of ourselves and those around us. Owens develops his account of these interests by beginning with a Humean form of skepticism about the (alleged) powers of promises: if our reasons are rooted in our motives, and our motives in our interests (whether in ourselves or others), how could a mere declaration change the reasons one has? Owens argues that there is a common explanation for both the power of promising and the power of consent to change the normative landscape, and this is our interest in normative control: control over the obligations that we and others have. This interest is closely related to, but ultimately distinct from, our non-normative interests in things that may be the object of choice.

The paradigm case for Owen's argument is rape. Owens follows John Gardner in maintaining that the wrong in rape is a "bare wronging" -- a wronging that is independent of our non-normative interests in bodily integrity (66 ff.). Rape very often involves harms to bodily interests, but even when it does not, or even when such wrongs can be alleviated (say, by tranquilizers), the basic wrong of rape remains untouched. Consent and only consent is the only way for sexual intercourse not to constitute such a wrong. In fact, Owens argues that even choice cannot avert rape (70). "'No means No' even where the perpetrator is correct in supposing that the victim wish them [sic] to go ahead" (70). This is precisely because the normative interest in control has parted company with the non-normative interest in bodily integrity. The strength of this conclusion invites one to wonder whether these two kinds of interests are or should be taken to be as independent as Owens makes them out to be, but the paper offers a persuasive case that we have such interests in normative control.

Peter Vallentyne argues in the fifth essay, "Enforcement Rights against Non-Culpable Non-Just Intrusion," for an element of the enforcement component of rights-theory. This element addresses "non-just" intrusions (instances in which the requirements of rights are not satisfied, either as the result of a non-autonomous choice of the intruder, or as a matter of infringement of the right). The question is the extent of the liberty the rights-holder has to inflict harm upon the intruder, given facts about the harm the intrusion will impose upon various parties (the rights-holder, the intruder, and others), the harms the response will inflict on these parties, and the response alternatives available to the rights-holder. Vallentyne is meticulous in setting out the various elements that go into his proposal, and there is far too much detail to summarize adequately here. The effect is a defense of a sufficiency condition on permissible enforcement, and a promissory note on necessary and sufficient conditions for such enforcement. Those working in rights theory, or more interested generally in the moral issues surrounding self-defense, other-defense, innocent threats, and so on, may do well to engage Vallentyne's study.

The final paper, by Elizabeth Harman, asks, "Does Moral Ignorance Exculpate?" Her answer, in response to Gideon Rosen, is essentially "no." Harman works through a number of cases in which, Rosen claims, wrong actions are nevertheless blameless due to ignorance of non-moral facts (e.g., what one takes to be sugar is really arsenic) or moral facts (e.g., a Hittite slaveholder believes slavery is permissible). One issue is the role of the source of the relevant ignorance: whether one is culpable for the management of one's beliefs. Rosen and Harman agree that this sort of ignorance is not necessarily exculpatory. But Rosen maintains, and Harman denies, that if there is no fault in the management of beliefs, then the ignorance is exculpatory. Harman maintains that we can be obligated to believe the moral truths relevant to our actions, and be blameworthy for failing to do so, even if we have not mismanaged our beliefs (111). The dispute here is thus a blameworthiness analog to the dispute between Bernard Williams and his various opponents over Williams' claim that reasons for action must be "internal," with his opponents denying that the lack of a pertinent motive in one's "subjective motivational set" undercuts the claim that one has reason of a sort to act. I do not know whether the lessons from one debate might carry over to the other (in either direction), but as with the other papers in this collection, Harman's piece is carefully crafted and argued.

Some general remarks in closing: the title of the collection, Developing Deontology, is curious in two ways. First, while arguably the papers in the collection may be seen as originating from within a certain framework for thinking about ethics (that is, deontology), there is no attempt to develop that framework in any significant way. The papers do not engage each other at all, and it would be a challenge to identify the larger commitments they share. It might be true that each is a piece in a distinct broadly deontological ethical view, but this is not the place to look for, say, a systematic deontological reply to challenges to that framework from consequentialists or virtue ethics. Still, the collection is a powerful indicator of cutting-edge issues in deontological theory.

Second, the contributions these papers make are hardly limited to deontological ethics. For example, Stratton-Lake's and Owens' papers may well be especially congenial to contractualism. I can imagine ways in which Wedgwood's and Vallentyne's papers might be of value in a sophisticated consequentialism. The arguments in these essays will be of interest to many beyond the pale of deontology. For those who are interested in the topics these essays address within any normative ethical framework, the volume and its contributions may be quite valuable.

1] Stephen Darwall’s The Second-Person Standpoint (Harvard, 2006) being perhaps the apotheosis of this kind of argument.

[2] In “The Trolley Problem,” Yale Law Journal 94: 1395-1415.