Developing the Virtues: Integrating Perspectives

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Julia Annas, Darcia Narvaez, and Nancy E. Snow (eds.), Developing the Virtues: Integrating Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2016, 309pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190271466.

Reviewed by Susan A. Stark, Bates College


The last 60 years has seen a resurgence of interest in virtue theory, especially by philosophers, psychologists, and theologians. For some of that time, each discipline worked in isolation. But recently, these disciplines have been listening and talking to one another; the result is an emerging view of virtue that is empirically informed as well as philosophically and theologically relevant. But even during this time of increased collaboration, still the idea of developing the virtues has been overlooked. This interdisciplinary volume begins to fill this gap.

It brings together experts in philosophy, psychology, and theology and is an outgrowth of the "Notre Dame Symposium on Virtue and Its Development." The aim of that symposium and this volume is to foster not simply collaboration of experts in different fields, but also work that is truly interdisciplinary, where each contributor brings these different fields to bear on their work. This volume does a good job moving toward interdisciplinarity in this sense. While each chapter in the volume retains some disciplinary focus, many of the chapters represent the perspective of at least two disciplines.

The volume itself is organized around five interrelated questions (p. 3): 1. How does virtue development begin in early childhood and continue into adulthood? 2. Are virtues global (like compassion or justice) or local (helpful under specific circumstances but not others)? How can local virtues become more global? 3. What is the nature of virtue? 4. How do early life and relationships affect the development of virtues? 5. How do justice and benevolence develop?

The volume has at least two important strengths. First, while the issue of situationism (the idea that actions are the result of situations, not character traits) is clearly important for empirically informed virtue theory, a disproportionate amount of the recent debate has been focused on this issue. This volume acknowledges situationism (see chapters 6 and 7) but also moves beyond it. A number of the chapters do so by considering the question of how the virtues are developed and whether virtue development involves automatic processing or some amount of reflective processing (see especially chapters 4, 5, 6, 8, and 9). A second strength is that many of the chapters consider the role of emotion in virtue and in virtue acquisition (see especially chapters 4, 6, and 11). These chapters do a good job of moving the debate beyond the situationist critique to elucidating the role of emotion in virtue, clarifying the structure of motivation in the virtuous person, and revealing the nature of virtue itself.

Turning now to the individual essays, in "Baselines for Virtue" Darcia Narvaez argues that understanding virtue by focusing on the most recent 15,000 years of human existence (as she says, "since 'civilization' began" (p. 14)) is misleading. Rather, she argues, appealing to evidence from anthropology, evolution, and neurobiology, the baselines for virtue are better located in understanding the processes that developed over the whole course of human existence. Narvaez focuses on our mammalian nature, the extreme immaturity of the human at birth and for many months thereafter, and the relative dependency of the human child for many years. Narvaez critiques contemporary (and historical) childrearing practices and suggests that the modern understanding of human nature (as autonomous, rebellious, self-interested) arose out of these inadequate childrearing practices. Instead she believes that baselines for virtue emerge out of small-band hunter-gatherer societies.

While I believe that there are many reasons to critique contemporary childrearing practices--I doubt they promote flourishing of children, primary caregivers (many of whom are women), or non-primary caregivers (who often are men)--Narvaez might have further emphasized the gendered nature and consequences of this debate. Without addressing gender, one might worry that women will bear the burden of implementing these improved childrearing practices and that doing so will reinforce oppressions based on gender (and perhaps on race and class as well).

In "Moral Self-Identity and the Social-Cognitive Theory of Virtue," Daniel Lapsley bridges the literatures of psychology and philosophy. He makes use of Robert Frost's poem, "The Mending Wall," as a metaphor for the contemporary boundary between ethics and psychology. Lapsley argues that the better interpretation of the poem is not the typical one that having a wall makes a good neighbor, but that working together to mend the wall or take it down is what makes good neighbors. He further suggests that it is "spring mending time" for philosophy and psychology to walk our wall together and ensure that we are doing "empirically responsible moral philosophy" and "philosophically responsible moral psychology." This essay is a nice model for how to do both.

In "From a Baby Smiling: Reflections on Virtues in Development," Robert N. Emde examines parenting for moral development from a psychiatric perspective. He looks at the issues of emotions, social and moral development in infants, and the cultivation of what he calls the "REV functions": reciprocity (taking turns), empathy (concern for others), and valuation (internalizing expectations), which are all crucial features of the development of the social self. Evidence seems to point to the fact that the capacity for these three functions is biologically based or inborn (p. 74). Emde argues that virtue promotion seems to be most successful when parenting during infancy and toddlerhood promotes the development of the REV functions.

In "The Development of Virtuous Character: Automatic and Reflective Dispositions," Ross A. Thompson and Abby S. Lavine continue the emphasis on the moral development of children, examining the effects of stress and secure attachment. They argue that early influences make the future development of virtue easier or harder. They also argue that moral development occurs not only, and not primarily, when a child misbehaves. Rather, ordinary conversations about feelings are crucial for moral development. These conversations are believed to become part of the child's broader understanding of desirable and undesirable conduct and "more important, why conduct is desirable or not" (p. 107).

These last two chapters represent important arguments and the syntheses of valuable research. Specifically, they raise consciousness about the way approaches to parenting can have long-term consequences for children. How we parent, however, is a highly gendered matter and is also often a matter that implicates race and social class. Moreover, shifts in parenting practices have been seen as a matter to be addressed by individuals and individual families. But parenting is a social practice that is implicated in the distribution of benefits and burdens in society. Having a more just approach to parenting (that crucially considers the good of children) also demands an approach to parenting that is more just with regard to gender, race, and social class. These two chapters might have done more to address the complexities of these issues.

In "Developmental Virtue Ethics," Christine Swanton aims to distinguish "developmental" virtue ethics from the broader field of virtue ethics. Developmental virtue ethics regards human beings as constantly developing throughout all life stages. The developmentalist thus regards the very concept of virtue as informed by the ways humans are developing throughout the trajectory of their lives: from infants, to children, to mature, but improving, adults. Swanton argues that though individuals who are cultivating the virtues are constantly improving, virtue need not be a perfectionist notion that is either achieved or not achieved. Rather, virtue is a dispositional state of character that is "good enough" (p. 119). Swanton also argues that different stages of life call for different virtues, and thus argues, against Aristotelian orthodoxy, that children can possess certain virtues (e.g. patience, where the degree of patience required for the 3-year-old might be different from that required for the 30-year-old).

Nancy E. Snow, in "How Habits Make Us Virtuous," responds to the situationist critique of practical rationality. The critique holds that much moral action is motivated or influenced by non-conscious, automatic processes. Deliberative reason, long thought to be the staple of moral cognition, may not determine our actions. Moreover, situationists maintain that moral cognition is a fragmented mix of conscious and nonconscious processing and that this fragmentation is insufficient to sustain the idea of virtue. Snow replies to this critique with the idea of habit, developing this idea in three ways: the folk approach to the acquisition of virtue, an Aristotelian approach (that follows Julia Annas), and a Confucian approach. This chapter does a nice job of synthesizing three disparate approaches to address this updated situationist challenge: all three approaches differently blend conscious and nonconscious processing so that the two sorts of processing function together in the acquisition of virtue.

Christian B. Miller continues the focus on situationism in "Virtue Cultivation in Light of Situationism." He organizes his approach under three subheadings: "Trait Rarity," "Surprising Dispositions," and "Lack of Traditional Virtue." Focusing on four situationist studies (p. 160), Miller argues that we do have these surprising dispositions (the disposition to be helpful after we have found a dime, for instance), and that we lack some traits that have traditionally been supposed to be virtues (compassion or honesty). Having conceded these points, the second half of the chapter mines the philosophical literature for strategies to respond to the situationist. Though Miller does not fully develop it, the most promising strategy is "getting the word out," or informing people of their surprising dispositions.

Rachana Kamtekar further addresses a thread of Miller's argument against situationism (the nature of virtuous traits) in "Becoming Good: Narrow Dispositions and the Stability of Virtue." Kamtekar distinguishes two processes for the cultivation of virtue: an Aristotelian process whereby humans educate their automatic processes (appetites, emotions, associations, etc.) and the "Nudge" process. According to the Nudge approach, because automatic processes are nonconscious, education of them is not possible. Instead the Nudge approach urges the development of "policies and institutions" that will ensure morally correct actions (p. 185). Kamtekar does not take sides between these two approaches. Instead, she highlights three themes about virtue acquisition. First, she argues that virtue need not be thought of as rare. Virtue may be common or rare, but this is a contingent matter. Second, she argues that virtues can be developed as narrow, situation-specific dispositions. And third, she argues that we should not expect one process to lead to each of these narrow, situation-specific dispositions, but that we should consider each disposition one-by-one, seeking the best process to its acquisition.

In "The Role of Motivation and Wisdom in Virtue as Skills," Matt Stichter develops the skills model of the virtues. He examines the psychological research on expertise and argues that motivation is an important component of expertise (p. 204). Moreover, he argues that practical wisdom itself is not a skill, but that it does nonetheless help us in moral judgment. Finally, and crucially, Stichter argues that practical wisdom must be informed by consideration of issues of power in the social contexts in which we are making decisions. Without this, our "practical wisdom" will only serve to reinforce injustices in those social contexts.

Annas, in "Learning Virtue Rules: The Issue of Thick Concepts", considers the important question of the relationship between thick moral concepts ("generous" or "brave") and thin moral concepts ("morally right" or "good"). Annas argues that the descriptive and evaluative elements of thick concepts cannot be disentangled. She also argues that non-virtuous people cannot fully understand virtuous concepts or terms (the concepts need not be intelligible apart from a particular epistemological perspective: that of the moral expert). And finally, she argues that evaluative concepts are shapeless with regard to descriptive concepts (in other words, there is no codifiable relationship between descriptive and evaluative concepts) and that this shapelessness is unproblematic. These claims are familiar to some philosophical accounts of virtue; and though this paper may not represent a full defense of any of these points, it serves to sharpen, highlight, and advance these debates.

Jennifer A. Herdt, in "Guilt and Shame in the Development of Virtue," considers whether these two emotions of self-assessment are positive or negative influences in moral development. She argues that guilt is largely positive, while shame is more negative but still important. And even though the morally perfect person would feel neither guilt nor shame, Herdt argues that both guilt and shame have an important place in moral development. Guilt can increase empathy and promote moral motivation. And, though more problematic, when one takes up a theological perspective, shame can be seen as offering an important opportunity for transformation, redemption, and atonement.

In "Benevolence in a Justice-Based World: The Power of Sentiments (and Reasoning) in Predicting Prosocial Behaviors," Gustavo Carlo and Alexandra N. Davis examine two dominant moral perspectives (justice and benevolence) and consider which is more effective in producing prosocial behaviors: moral reasoning or moral sentiments. Looking at the empirical literature in psychology, Carlo and Davis argue that though both reasoning and sentiments are important morally, benevolent sentiments are more central in determining what is "good and just." (p. 256).

Finally, in "Norms of Justice in Development," Mark Lebar asks how individuals become just people. His response builds on work in empirical moral psychology by Lawrence Kohlberg. Lebar modifies Kohlberg's approach, drawing on the work of Friedrich Hayek to sketch the evolutionary roots and development of justice. Justice is an important virtue and Lebar's approach is a novel one to explain the development of this virtue. At the same time, Kohlberg's work has been criticized as lacking a balanced approach to gender. His scale of moral development has been criticized as representing just the perspective of one gender and not being representative of people of all genders. Some may take this criticism to disqualify Lebar's approach. But at the very least, I would have liked this final essay to acknowledge this critique and attempt to address it.

Overall, I find this volume does just what the title says it will do. It brings together perspectives on virtue theory from psychology, theology, and philosophy. A number of the authors appear not only to have their work informed by other disciplines, but also appear to occupy more than one perspective in their work. This book is a thoughtful, sophisticated, and engaging discussion of the development of virtues. Though the papers sometimes consider the wider social effects of the views they defend, my main criticism is that I would have liked the papers to consider diversity, especially gender, racial, and class diversity, in a more sustained way. Even still, this volume is indispensible for anyone studying philosophically informed empirical psychology and empirically informed philosophy and theology.