Dewey: A Beginner's Guide

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David L. Hildebrand, Dewey: A Beginner's Guide, Oneworld Publications, 2008, 247pp., $14.95 (pbk.), ISBN 9781851685806.

Reviewed by Michael Eldridge, University of North Carolina at Charlotte



The most recent addition to the genre that includes books by Sidney Hook (1939), Richard Bernstein (1966), James Campbell (1995), and Raymond Boisvert (1998), Hildebrand’s introduction is a knowledgeable and clearly written exposition of John Dewey’s thought for those with little or no philosophical preparation and/or no background in Dewey.

Thus it is of interest to academic philosophers for its value as a course text but also to others, philosophers or not, who are just coming to Dewey. Either way it is a reliable — and readable — guide to Dewey’s thought, making use of the immense amount of recent Dewey scholarship. One should, however, not expect a critical assessment, despite the blurb on the back cover that says “This concise and critical look at Dewey’s work”. The author explicitly says in the preface that his primary purpose was "to give the most detail of the widest range of Dewey’s views" (xi). It is a well-informed work of exposition with only occasional challenges to others’ interpretations.

The author’s earlier monograph, Beyond Realism and Antirealism: John Dewey and the Neopragmatists, ably presented and defended “the practical starting point of philosophy” (PSP). The present book is informed by this approach, as well as by a second guiding belief that was not present in the earlier study, meliorism. Both are crucial to an adequate understanding of Dewey’s distinctive approach and so in this more comprehensive study Hildebrand makes use of both.

Given Hildebrand’s emphasis on the PSP and his criticism of the theoretical starting point (TSP) that he faults neo-pragmatists for employing, one might think that he would have begun with a thick description of some experience and explicated Dewey’s thought in relation to it. This approach has been employed to a limited extent, notably by Todd Lekan, Steve Fesmire and Eddie Glaude. The latter writers exploit novels for expository purposes, and Lekan uses “Jane Addams’ account of the crisis that led her to decide to devote her life to a settlement house” (Making Morality, p. 33).

Hildebrand does make limited use of lived experience, but since his task is to cover as much as he can of Dewey’s vast corpus - 37 volumes in the critical edition with additional material now being published electronically - it would be difficult indeed to be constantly working outward from case material.

Hildebrand has chosen a more conventional approach that well portrays Dewey’s thinking in seven topical chapters that build on one another: experience, inquiry, ethics, politics, education, aesthetics and religion. Yet the author has attempted to write each as a stand-alone chapter. He succeeds in this. One does not need to start at the beginning and work one’s way through the book. Nevertheless, much is gained by doing so.

The first chapter deals with what many would regard as Dewey’s metaphysics, but fortunately Hildebrand does not invoke this contested (among Dewey scholars) interpretative device (see Seigfried, “Ghosts Walking Underground: Dewey’s Vanishing Metaphysics”). Rather he puts the focus where it belongs, on a simple and straightforward description of Dewey’s account of human conduct.

I will not rehearse all that Hildebrand does in this and the succeeding chapter on inquiry. Rather I will call attention to his discussion of Dewey’s treatment of a key notion and its implications. Most if not all commentators call attention to Dewey’s significant 1896 article on the reflex arc (RA), but Hildebrand’s is the most readable presentation I have encountered. And he does so without dumbing it down or misreading its significance.

Briefly, the RA was an attempt to describe action empirically in terms of cause and effect, calling attention to a stimulus and the response it evoked. These were understood to be discrete and correlative. Dewey, while embracing the intention, thought the standard analysis was reductive and needed to be understood more contextually. In the standard example, a child sees a burning candle (stimulus), touches it (response), is burned (stimulus), and recoils (response). This, Dewey argued, does not capture the dynamic quality of the activity. Stimuli and responses are treated as separate events and isolated from the context in which they occur. “It is simply untrue,” comments Hildebrand, "that organisms passively receive a stimulus and then become active responders. The nature of organisms is to interact continuously with their environment in a manner that is cumulative and mutually modifying." He continues, “No child is a passive spectator when he first encounters a candle; he is already actively engaged with his environment” (15f). The candle encounter occurs within an ongoing series of events and provides an opportunity for the child to modify his way of dealing with his environment.

So Dewey’s treatment functions as a holistic critique of the existing science and has implications for his efforts to pay attention to function and context in other areas of study, most importantly, notes Hildebrand, for how we learn. Regarding the consequence for science, he claims, "Scientific distinctions are not meaningful by reference to something essential or ‘real’ in a world beyond our experience; rather, their meaning can only be determined by relating them to specific situations, histories, and future experimental and practical consequences" (18). (In later chapters Hildebrand will make these implications clear in specific disciplines.) For the educational point, permit me to quote more extensively:

If experience is an ongoing-and-cumulative coordination, then learning, too, proceeds as a living rhythm — not by a series of truncated arcs, fits and starts. Learning is a movement from an initial disequilibrium (confusion, doubt) toward equilibrium (satisfaction, knowledge). The learner is not an empty vessel or a wax tablet, ‘impressed’ by discrete and external stimuli, but an agent actively engaged with her environment and growing insofar as she frames and uses events in experience (18).

This is why Dewey placed as much importance on education, both in school and out, as he did. Life is an on-going reconstructive activity that is enhanced by attention to this learning within and through what we do and what happens to us.

I will largely pass over the second chapter on inquiry, contenting myself with a summary statement from the conclusion regarding knowing as a form of coping with the world: "In this world — our life — we confront obstacles, formulate problems, devise solutions, and act experimentally." Dewey connects this interaction between knowing and living “first by explaining the natural roots of inquiry, and then by detailing how inquiry can work … to make life better” (61).

The third chapter deserves more attention because it is one of the best accounts of Dewey’s ethics that has been written. Hildebrand correctly points to Dewey’s identification of the mistaken assumption of western morality that regards interest and morality to be in opposition, for our sense of obligation arises in our various social relationships and thus many of our duties are felt needs. The moral conflict is not between what I want and what I must do. Rather a moral situation for Dewey is one in which competing goods are in conflict. I must choose between two things that I would like to do. Hence the need for inquiry. Rules and principles have a role but primacy in Dewey’s reconstruction of ethics belongs to inquiry, the intelligent choosing between incompatible ends.

The fourth and fifth chapters then work out this conception in terms of politics and education. A democracy is the appropriate political order for the resolution of conflicts between diverse ends, and education is the process of re-making one’s self, one’s practices, our institutions and our societies to enable us to live well. Thus Hildebrand neatly develops these core notions of Dewey, showing how Dewey’s reconstructive approach plays itself out in our lives.

Hildebrand then turns to art and aesthetics, showing how art is captured experience, or better, the embodiment of experience. Dewey claims that “to esthetic experience … the philosopher must go to understand what experience is” (Dewey, 278). Aesthetics is then not an add-on to Dewey’s pragmatic or instrumentalist philosophy; it provides understanding of and guidance for living. Inquiry is the way we transform experience to achieve the consummatory quality that we find most readily in art.

Finally, in the last chapter Hildebrand turns to religion, showing how Dewey thought that one could re-frame in religious terms the naturalistic, inquiry-based, aesthetically-rich life that he recommended.

My own view, as developed in Transforming Experience, is that Dewey’s re-framing does not work. Readers tend to read the religious language he uses — faith, God, piety — in their conventional meanings, thus misunderstanding the naturalistic reconstruction that Dewey proposes. But, to Hildebrand’s credit, he does not enter into this sort of criticism. He sticks to his task, resolutely presenting what Dewey thought about a variety of topics. More so, he does this in a way that enables the reader to grasp the connectedness and significance of Dewey’s thinking.

My sketch of the book does not do justice to the richness and intelligence of Hildebrand’s work. I have, as a reviewer must do, summarized. But since the book being reviewed is itself a summary, additional distortion has necessarily incurred. There is much in Dewey that needs to be re-thought, both in the sense that his thinking is useful and in the sense that he may not have gotten it right for his time or for ours. But Hildebrand has done an admirable job of presenting a Dewey for beginners that may prove to be beneficial for them. He has left to the rest of us the task of correcting Dewey.

Works Cited

Richard Bernstein, John Dewey (New York: Washington Square Press, 1966).

Raymond Boisvert, John Dewey: Rethinking Our Time (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998).

James Campbell, Understanding John Dewey: Nature and Cooperative Intelligence (Chicago: Open Court Publishing Company, 1995).

John Dewey, The Later Works, 1925-1953 (Carbondale and Edwardsville: Southern Illinois Press, 1987); vol. 10: Art as Experience.

Michael Eldridge, Transforming Experience: John Dewey’s Cultural Instrumentalism (Nashville and London: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998).

Steven Fesmire, John Dewey and Moral Imagination (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003).

Eddie S. Glaude, Jr., In a Shade of Blue: Pragmatism and the Politics of Black America (Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press, 2007).

David L. Hildebrand, Beyond Realism and Antirealism: John Dewey and the Neopragmatists (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 2003).

Sidney Hook, John Dewey: An Intellectual Portrait (New York: John Day Co.,1939).

Todd Lekan, Making Morality: Pragmatist Reconstruction in Ethical Theory (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 2003).

Charlene Haddock Seigfried, “Ghosts Walking Underground: Dewey’s Vanishing Metaphysics,” Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society 40:1(Winter, 2004), 1-29.