Dewey and the Ancients: Essays on Hellenic and Hellenistic Themes in the Philosophy of John Dewey

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Christopher C. Kirby (ed.), Dewey and the Ancients: Essays on Hellenic and Hellenistic Themes in the Philosophy of John Dewey, Bloomsbury, 2014, 208pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9871472510556.

Reviewed by Scott F. Aikin, Vanderbilt University


Christopher Kirby's edited volume brings together eleven new essays focused on John Dewey's readings and critical appropriations of ancient philosophy. While there is much to like about this volume, there is also much to question. The essays are distributed among four topics: Dewey and the Greek Tradition, Dewey and Plato, Dewey and Aristotle, and Dewey and Hellenistic Thought. Most of the essays focus on Dewey's inheritance from Plato and/or Aristotle. There are only two essays on the intersection with Hellenistic philosophy (the Epicureans and the Pyrrhonists). This leaves the Stoics and Academics completely ignored, which seems a serious lacuna given the Stoics' practical outlook and the Academic program of fallibilism. But it is unfair to criticize a book for what it is not, so I will instead focus on what the book is.

At first blush, a book on Dewey's reading of ancient philosophy seems an academic excess. His references to the ancients, positive or negative, seem ancillary to his main philosophical program. As John Herman Randall famously quipped, Dewey "has been more interested in making history than writing it" (1951: 79). Moreover, Dewey's critiques and extensions of the various ancient traditions are generally either done better by others or are merely tepid. The veritable trickle of scholarly work on the topic, despite the torrent on a wide variety of other connections between Dewey and the history of philosophy, seems testament to the fact that this is a desolate problem area. What's to be said about the ancients won't be very helpful, and what will be revealing about Dewey will be more helpfully done by way of looking at his engagement with the moderns or his contemporaries. Call this the pessimistic presumption.

Kirby's volume is posed as a counterpoint this pessimism. He pauses in his introduction to acknowledge the challenge:

In the six decades since his death, Dewey's work has inspired a staggering amount of research and secondary literature on various aspects of his philosophy. Yet, in all of that effort, one could nearly count on one hand the number of philosophical investigations made into Dewey's interest in ancient thought, despite the . . . numerous instances of admiration and criticism of figures such as Socrates, Plato and Aristotle. (xiv)

In contrast, Kirby holds that it is "particularly odd" that there is not more critical literature on Dewey and the ancients. . His friends regularly invoked classical references to describe his project, and Dewey himself often paused to highlight his debt to the Greeks. He called for a "back to Plato" movement in his "From Absolutism to Experimentalism" (LW 5: 1930, p. 151), and in his 1934 entry on philosophy for the Encyclopedia of the Social Sciences, he claimed that "in Greek philosophy the problems of Western philosophy are either formulated or adumbrated" (LW 8: 1934, p. 19). In The Quest for Certainty and Experience and Nature, Greek thought served as the main source of the divide between theory and practice, and ultimately for the modern version of the spectator theory of knowledge (LW 4: 1929, pp. 4,19; LW 1: 1925, pp. 55, 80). Aristotle appeared in "The Influence of Darwinism on Philosophy" as the bogey with his unchanging notion of species, the eidos, which the Darwinian revolution is supposed to overthrow (MW 4: 1910).

The ancients play a role for Dewey, to be sure. The question, however, is not whether there are affinities or contrasts to be drawn between philosophers or whether one philosopher refers to another. What would be truly strange would be for none of that to happen. Rather, the issue for critical work is whether the contrasts are fruitful, the critical exchanges trenchant and the references illuminative.

Despite Kirby's efforts, the pessimistic thought returns. Dewey's call for a "back to Plato" movement is less a return to Plato's texts or to the Platonic aspirations, but a preference for the "dramatic, restless, co-operative inquiring Plato . . . whose highest flight of metaphysics always terminated with a practical turn" (LW 5: 1930, p. 151). Pretty tame stuff, and more a comment on pragmatist interpretive preference than philosophical critique. The same, as it turns out, is the case for the other high points. Dewey's work on the ancients regarding the theory-practice divide is less about philosophers, who worked regularly to connect the two (as Dewey himself noted explicitly with the "back to Plato" movement case), and more about class difference. And the Darwinian counterpoint to Aristotle's essences might be fine for empirical concepts such as biological species, but it is a hasty generalization to take the critical point to extend to modally robust notions like substance or cause.

Given this view, the ancients did regularly make appearances in Dewey's work, but they were usually mere foils for his own views at best, straw men at worst. Dewey's view of philosophy and its history was a kind of pragmatist triumphalism, holding that his dialectical opponents were corrected by the science of his day and that they were caught in social circumstances that did not allow them to see or say things clearly. The pragmatist stands above it all as the scientifically informed and socially responsible philosopher. This triumphalist view overwhelms all opposing programs. Dewey announces that his pragmatism is "the way, and the only way . . . by which one can freely accept the standpoint and conclusions of modern science" (LW 1: 4). Yes, there is scholarly work to be done in the wake of such a view, but it seems custodial at its core -- either keeping a triumphalist program running or cleaning up its messes. Too many of the essays in Kirby's volume simply confirm this pessimistic view.

Joel Amnott's extension of Dewey's theory of inquiry into an exchange with the Pyrrhonists, in his "The Peace of the Sword: Dewey and Pyrrhonian Skepticism," is almost entirely based on triumphalist pragmatist reconstruction of dialectical oppositions prior to actual engagement. Amnott attributes to the Pyrrhonists Dewey's diagnosis of two errors committed by those holding the 'spectator theory of knowledge': that the criterion for knowledge is external to the process of knowing, and that philosophy locates the ground for knowledge in the eternal, thus eliminating possible error (201). But Amnott provides no evidence for attributing these commitments to Sextus Empiricus or any other Pyrrhonist. Surely this is because had they explicitly made these commitments, they would have broken with their skeptical resistance to dogmatism -- even in epistemic norms. Amnott does correctly identify the initial impetus for inquiry as the desire for ataraxia, particularly the thought that knowledge will yield a world where there is more tranquility. But he overlooks the pragmatist overtones in this program (compare Peirce's theory of doubt and Quine on avoiding perceptual surprise), and he fails to see that the Pyrrhonist program of continued inquiry, zetetic philosophy, cannot be sustained except as a means for finding answers. One never would be capable of suspending judgment as a skeptic unless one weighed the conflicting evidence as evidence. Pyrrhonist skepticism, so understood in the zetetic vein, is in the spirit of inquiry, not a block to it.

John Anton's chapter, "Dewey and Ancient Philosophies: The Unfinished Cultural Project" is a sequel to his 1965 essay, "John Dewey and Ancient Philosophies." In the earlier essay, Anton divided Dewey's relationship with the Greeks into three types: (i) polemical, (ii) historical-contextual, and (iii) cumulative. In the polemical and historical modes, Dewey is either critically reacting to or historicizing elements of classical philosophy. The third cumulative aspect was a curiosity in Anton's original essay -- in what way is Dewey really an extension of the Greeks, given the other two elements that seem to prevent such contact? (For that matter, we can ask whether Dewey's theoretical criticism is consistent with his historical relativizing.) Anton's new answer is that Dewey extends the classical program of political experimentalism. In this light, Plato's Republic is not an enemy to open societies, but it rather serves as a critical program of reform. And such a program is on the road to Dewey's views.

In my view, if Plato were alive today he would propose the attainment of arête as the condition that best compares with Dewey's proposal of "democracy as a way of life." (6)

This is triumphalism at its boldest, in the vein of: had Plato only read some Dewey. Anton's reasoning is that the Platonic democracies miss a piece Dewey sees as integral and possible to provide: education.

the conduct of the citizens who were not prepared to live 'democratically' [was] due to the fact that they lacked the proper preparation while living under the conditions of oligarchy. (7)

With education, we stop the slide to tyranny, and thereby we make democracy stable and conducive of excellence. But Anton does not address the Platonic concern that what initiates the precipitous progression from the aristocratic state to tyranny is educational collapse. Plato would agree that education is key, but that democracies are places where education in the proper sense can't work. As Socrates notes, in democracies "teachers fear and flatter their students, while students despise their teachers" (Republic 563a). Who does not sympathize with Plato when student evaluations affect tenure decisions?

Albert Spencer's essay, "The Dialogues as Dramatic Rehearsal," takes Dewey's program of a "back to Plato" movement seriously, returning to the dialogues as dramatic and restless. In turn, Spencer puts a pragmatist gloss on the metaphors for justice, particularly that of accounting or debt-repayment, as the object of Platonic critique (101). This is a promising interpretive line, but Spencer then takes the program to extend to Glaucon's challenge of Gyges' ring, instead of Adeimantus' challenge that injustice allows one to settle up with the gods later with sacrifices and offerings (Republic 365e). And notice that this miss is of particular importance for pragmatists, since the cases are supposed to be the 'problems of men,' and Adeimantus' model is much more psychologically plausible than Glaucon's. In fact, Adeimantus has a living example of his model in Cephalus.

Other essays are more successful. I will note three. Kevin Decker's "Dewey, Aristotle and the Spectator Theory of Knowledge" is a well-framed reply to John Herman Randall's closing lines of his "Dewey's Interpretation of the History of Philosophy" that "it is not difficult to exhibit Dewey as an Aristotelian more Aristotelian than Aristotle himself" (1951: 102). There are many theoretical connections between the two: their common-sense realism and their interest in productive sciences are primary. But Decker holds that, by Deweyan lights, these practical elements are insufficiently emphasized in Aristotle: "Dewey seems to think that the presence of the spectator theory in epistemology automatically entails a particularly sedentary vision of the good. In Aristotle, he finds this equated with the contemplative life" (146). And so, for principled metaphilosophical reasons, Dewey's views are significantly more distant from Aristotle's than acknowledged.

Another useful essay is Heather E. Keith's "Beyond Fixed Ends and Limited Moral Community," in which Dewey's and Aristotle's shared interest in practical reasoning comes into tight focus. Keith notes that both thinkers attend to the social contexts and conditions for ethics, and Dewey's notion of habit owes much to Aristotle's hexis. Both philosophers' views are augmented by contemporary psychological research on virtue and ethics, particularly those in happiness studies and those presenting embodied emotional responses as at the core of our moral judgments. Keith's findings here put pragmatist-Aristotelian ethics in contact with social (and empirical) ethics, wherein one views "the moral world first in terms of relationships" (161).

Charles Hobbs' "Epicurean Pragmatism" is a judicious reading of Dewey's crypto-Hegelian invocation of "the element of truth in Epicureanism." The truth to be mined, Hobbs argues, is the primacy of the present for ethical thought. And further, Hobbs notes, Dewey was careful to shield the Epicureans from the slander of voluptuousness associated with their name, and so argued himself that "the simple life is the good life, because it is the one most assured of present enjoyment" (188). Hobbs then takes Dewey's critical line to be that this Epicurean truth also holds the seeds of its questionable singular identification of the good with pleasure, since the question of pluralism looms for goods in practice. This question of pluralism is precisely the kind of challenge Epicureans and pragmatists about value must face.

There is, again, much to like about Kirby's volume. In addition to the three essays mentioned, Vasiliki Karavakou's essay on education as a reply to Plato's Cave is inventive, and Kirby's own essay on Greek organic naturalisms and their connection with Dewey's naturalism is illuminating. However, there is much that disappoints. Pragmatist triumphalism abounds to the detriment of real engagement with the ancients. It is a pity that efforts in this fledgling area of research on the pragmatism-ancient philosophy nexus have had such uneven results.


Randall, John Herman. 1951. "Dewey's Interpretation of the History of Philosophy." In The Philosophy of John Dewey. Edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp. Tudor Publishing: New York, 77-102.