Deweyan Experimentalism and the Problem of Method in Political Philosophy

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Joshua Forstenzer, Deweyan Experimentalism and the Problem of Method in Political Philosophy, Routlege, 2019, 279pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138479906.

Reviewed by Scott F. Aikin, Vanderbilt University


Joshua Forstenzer's book is a timely and well-researched contribution to the ongoing development of pragmatist political philosophy. Forstenzer's core thesis is that Dewey's experimentalism is a useful resource and model for, on the one hand, criticizing the failure of ideal theory to address standing problems in politics, and on the other hand, resisting the moral quietism that too often plagues realist outlooks. As Forstenzer puts it, "we need a methodological approach which charts a via media between ideal theory and realism" (33).

Forstenzer's book is insightful and useful on two fronts: first, along the lines of updating and putting a fine point on the case against ideal theory, and second, in making the case for the relevance of Dewey's experimental method as a set of tools for articulating what active citizenship should be. But I have two challenges to Forstenzer's narrative, too. The first is whether the Deweyan program is as defensible as Forstenzer holds it is against the problem of reasonable pluralism. The second is whether Forstenzer's audience is already broadly Deweyan. In some sense, his regular response to challenges to Dewey's program is simply to add more Dewey. This strategy, of course, works only for those not objecting.

Let me start with the two significant virtues of Forstenzer's book. He proceeds with clarity and precision in making the case against ideal theory. Forstenzer distills his case to two problems:

dissatisfaction with this view focuses around two facts: (i) it unduly subordinates actual democratic deliberation to the abstract arguments of political philosophers, and (ii) it endlessly emphasizes the first highly abstract stage and fails to explain how the first stage has any bearing on the second stage of nonideal decision-making. (213)

The result, as Forstenzer sees it, is that this doubly misplaced emphasis yields a long list of lacunae in the work of political philosophers. Problems of philosophers are prioritized over those of citizens, real political problems are seen through the lenses of idealization, the necessity of tradeoffs and inevitability of moral diversity are downplayed, and the distorting influence of power is not given adequate consideration (34, 214). The Deweyan alternative is outlined as reorienting political philosophy as having practical objectives and cultural criticism, political philosophers as citizens first, the audience for political philosophy being other citizens, and the process of development of ideas as a set of connected tests of hypotheses. Thus, an experimentalist model for political philosophy. And, I should add, Forstenzer is careful to show that this program is in productive conversation with the going Marxist critical lines of thought along with many others. It is, indeed, a fecund and well-motivated practical political proposal.

One critical question, however, is whether the Deweyan model proposed can live up to the promise of addressing moral diversity in practical cases. In Rawlsian parlance, this is the problem of reasonable pluralism. Robert Talisse has argued that the Deweyan program fails this test, and Forstenzer proposes an answer to Talisse's challenge. [Full disclosure: Talisse is not only my colleague at Vanderbilt University, but he and I are regular collaborators. He and I have had ongoing discussions of this issue.] Talisse's challenge is that because Dewey's program depends on a distinctive view of human flourishing, it is reasonably rejectable. In particular, Dewey's political vision is one in which democratic engagement is a way of life that does not merely aggregate preferences, but it transforms and improves its participants. "Growth" is the Deweyan term for this complex of processes and improvements, and Talisse's objection is that on Dewey's model, those who do not agree with these preconditions for democracy are excluded or at least alienated from the program. That's undemocratic.

The challenge, then, is that it is not sufficient to be simply right about the goodness of a political arrangement, but one's reasons for it cannot be reasonably rejectable by those who participate in it. So long as non-pragmatists about value are reasonable (think of any utilitarian or Kantian who nevertheless participates in the democracy, each on the basis of their own respective view of the good), Dewey's program fails the test. Here Forstenzer wisely refuses to take the regular response embraced by many Deweyans who reject the requirement of public reason. Rather, he argues that Dewey can meet the challenge. On Forstenzer's story, Dewey's program is one that is, in Rawlsian terms, a thin theory of the good -- one that consists in minimal requirements for pursuing any good. "Growth," then, is not a thicker, substantive view of human flourishing, but it is, on Forstenzer's case, only a thin, procedural concept of how the good is pursued:

This means that 'growth' is defined by the development of certain capacities that serve one's more general capacity to solve problems. (196)

we must understand 'growth' not in relation to its consumatory character (i.e., the satisfaction we derive from developing our capacities to solve problems) but its functional or instrumental capacity to help in the task of solving problems intelligently. (197)

Once properly framed as a thin theory of value, Dewey's political philosophy of growth is supposed to pass the test of reasonable pluralism. The problem for Forstenzer's case, though, is that everything depends on what it means to intelligently solve problems. Every one of those three terms, on Dewey's reconstruction, is thick. In fact, the notions of intelligence and problem are positively pragmatically engorged. Dewey's theory of inquiry and situated doubts make this clear, as the contrastive case of pragmatism overcoming the "quest for certainty" could not be made without a theory of what properly counts as a problem or what counts as an intelligent response to it. This requires, on Forstenzer's case, "overcoming the tradition" (41) and clarifying what counts as "genuine doubts" (47) on the basis of "a full-throated attack on the spectator theory of knowledge" (49). Thinness here, given the broader pragmatist program of reconstruction of intelligence and problems, is an illusion.

My second critical response is that Forstenzer's book has, for lack of better terms, a dialecticality problem. In short, every critique of pragmatism is answered with, well, more pragmatism. The response to the Rawlsian challenge above, I think, is exemplary. To Deweyans, of course invocations of intelligent solutions to problems sounds thin, but that's because they think the Deweyan reconstructions of those terms is unproblematic. But to non-pragmatists, it all sounds pretty loaded. Another instance is Forstenzer's handling of the metaphilosophical pushback to pragmatist (and particularly Deweyan) instrumentalism. The challenge, simply, is that pragmatism makes philosophy an instrumental program, an intellectual activity with its goods outside of itself, and it merely is a means. The argument runs that philosophy should have some non-instrumental goods internal to it. Why does philosophy have to be good just for something else? Why can't philosophy be more like art, something with non-instrumental value? Beauty is good just by itself, not because it's good to get other stuff. Isn't philosophy like that, too? That's the objection to Dewey's instrumentalism, and so what is Forstenzer's reply?  "In response, Dewey does not so much reject the analogy as he rejects the assumption that art is a non-practical matter." (94).

Like I said, the response to challenges to pragmatism is just more pragmatism. To be fair, there is a theoretical virtue to this form of reply -- one displays the systematic nature of the Deweyan program, how the project of reconstruction in philosophy has global reach. Deweyan pragmatism is a big idea, and it has big implications. The trouble is that the bigness of the idea prevents Deweyans from seeing non-pragmatists as anything other than folks who haven't yet heard about the good news of pragmatism. Dewey himself is clear about this point, as by his lights, his pragmatism "provides the way, and the only way, . . . [to] freely accept the standpoint and conclusions of modern science . . . and yet maintain cherished values" (LW, 1:4). From the Deweyan perspective, all external criticism of pragmatism is merely a failure to understand the full system, and so it is met with more pragmatism.

To be clear, my two critical responses to Forstenzer's book amount to criticizing the Deweyan nature of the program, both in content and in presentation. To Deweyans, this is as it should be, and is, to their eyes, reflective of deep pragmatist virtues. But to non-Deweyans, this is a disappointment, but not exactly a surprise. All told, Forstenzer's book is exemplary in its scholarship and focus, and his aspirations to bring Dewey into conversation with contemporary political philosophy are welcome and fecund. The dialectical limits to the program, I believe, should not be ignored, but neither should its clarity and vision.