Diagrammatic Immanence: Category Theory and Philosophy

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Rocco Gangle, Diagrammatic Immanence: Category Theory and Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2016, 256pp., $132.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474404174.

Reviewed by Jean-Pierre Marquis, Université de Montréal


In this book, Rocco Gangle attempts to weave together three threads: an interpretation of immanence in Spinoza, Pierce and Deleuze, the construction of a model of ontology on diagrammatic relations and the introduction of the fundamental concepts of category theory to philosophers. The second and third threads are in fact, even according to Gangle, already interlaced. The book's six chapters exhibit the pattern of the tapestry: they alternate between philosophical discussions surrounding relational immanence and the introduction and discussion of the basic notions of category theory, sketching the model of an ontology of relational immanence at the same time. Thus, chapters 1, 3 and 5 focus on philosophers, Spinoza, Pierce and Deleuze respectively, and chapters 2, 4 and 6 are on category theory, namely on categories and functors in chapter 2, functor categories and presheaves in chapter 4 and adjunctions and topoi in chapter 6. The philosophical and the mathematical are supposed to converge via the language of diagrams since, as Gangle writes, "diagrams suggest themselves as a very general philosophical method conforming to the requirements of immanence." (p. 242)

The goal of the book is stated clearly in the introduction. It aims at presenting, developing and justifying three claims: (1) immanent metaphysics entails relational ontology; (2) diagrams are the appropriate method for investigating immanence immanently; and (3) category theory is the appropriate mathematics for modelling and investigating diagrams. These three claims, as well as the contents of each chapter, are briefly explained in the introduction.

These claims might sound ambitious, obscure and vague. In a sense, they are. But the author is very well aware that his book is more an essay than a thesis. Its central motivation, it seems to me, is really to propose a new method, to break the standard linguistic framework used by philosophers, especially in the analytic tradition, by offering new tools for philosophical exploration, namely diagrammatic tools. Thus, the point is not to articulate a comprehensive presentation of the philosophical systems of Spinoza, Peirce and Deleuze. It is not Gangle's conviction that the three philosophers share fundamentally the same views. He believes, however, that they have one thing in common and that is precisely why they figure in the book: immanence. In the same spirit, the book is not, as such, a mathematical introduction to category theory. It is written for non-mathematicians and, thus, relies heavily on the understanding of diagrams and figures. The hope, I suppose, is that the diagrammatic method introduced and used will allow philosophers to understand a formal language that could then be used to address other philosophical questions.

Does the book achieve this goal? In order to answer this question, I need to come back to the philosophical issues considered by Gangle and how the diagrammatic method is supposed to be philosophically useful. It would be foolish to try to summarize his presentation of Spinoza, Peirce and Deleuze. I will simply sketch how Gangle treats Spinoza, to see how he believes that Spinoza's metaphysical views can be translated into diagrammatic language and whether this translation provides new insights.

Spinoza's philosophy has always been a challenge, a mystery, and it still triggers a sense of fascination. In the present state of the world, it is hard to claim that it is not relevant today. One of its distinctive and difficult features is certainly its metaphysics. This is where the concept of relational immanence comes in. For Gangle, relational immanence is a metaphysical view according to which there are only relations, relations between relations, relations between relations between relations, and so on. There are no 'things' together with relations between them. There are only relations. Thus, the first chapter presents the main elements of Spinoza's Ethics, together with the various problems related to its structure and interpretation. The reader should conclude that Spinoza was defending a kind of relational immanence. I believe it is worth quoting Gangle as he explains how to go from Spinoza's metaphysics to diagrams. He begins the second chapter with:

Let us presume as a working hypothesis that the views expressed in Spinoza's Ethics are in broad strokes metaphysically and ontologically correct. We thus presume that what really exist are relational structures of infinite variety and that these structures everywhere enter in turn into higher-order relations with one another and so on without limit . . . Our aim is to develop a workable method for plunging philosophically into this immanent relational sea. (p. 70)

The reader is then guided through various mathematical notions with their diagrammatic representations: directed graphs, partial orders, sets as partial orders, then functions and finally categories, the notion of universal mapping property, and functors. The presentation unfolds at a leisurely pace, starting with concrete examples and trying to abstract specific notions from them. Diagrams are indeed used throughout the chapter. They are not, however, the simple commutative diagrams of category theory. Gangle introduces additional notational conventions to include the dynamic aspect of diagrams, acknowledging in a footnote that here he is following Peter Freyd's lead. Indeed, even with the standard commutative diagrams of category theory, one has to learn how to read and write such diagrams. They are built up in steps, and the order is often crucial. When you read a textbook or an article in category theory, you have to know how to deconstruct its diagrams. The simplest way is usually to draw the diagrams from scratch and thus see why the result holds. That being said, Gangle's various notational additions are clear and useful, although I did find the layout and the symbols clumsy at times. There is one particular case where I thought that the method developed by Gangle was simply wrong: the diagram on page 228 introducing the subobject classifier is too cumbersome. But this is in only one diagram, so I may be being too harsh here.

Do these concepts and methods allow us to navigate on the "immanent relation sea"? I find the case of Spinoza perfectly reasonable. Indeed, in the universe of categories, the mathematical concepts have a "field-like" character instead of an "atomic" character. Thus, you can use the way mathematical concepts are described, studied and known in categories to illustrate a type of metaphysics in which you can easily imagine that there is basically one substance with different modes. It might indeed help develop different ways of thinking about beings, metaphysics and ontology in general.

The next two groups of chapters follow the same strategy. Gangle presents certain philosophical elements of Peirce and Deleuze, namely the aspects that are directly linked to relational immanence, and then tries to show how categorical notions and their diagrammatic rendition can illustrate and/or instantiate some of the philosophical concepts involved. As the book unfolds, both the philosophical and mathematical concepts become more difficult and complex. I admire Gangle's courage in introducing adjoint functors in chapter 6. The main idea of adjunction is clearly presented, although I am far from sure that the reader will fully understand how pervasive and powerful it is. And although I was able to follow how you could move from Spinoza's metaphysics to the category of categories, I failed to understand how adjunctions were supposed to clarify Deleuze's views on immanence. I should note, however, that adjunctions quickly received a philosophical interpretation in the mind of William Lawvere, one of important mathematicians in the 1960s, who thought of them for a while as the proper formalization of dialectical materialism since it captured the idea of the unity of opposites. Of course, Lawvere is not a philosopher and he never articulated this interpretation in a philosophical journal. Another mathematician, Joachim Lambek, did develop the idea in a paper that appeared in 1981, referring this time to Heraclitus. This indicates how the concept can lead to different philosophical interpretations.

I must admit that I did find the language used rather obscure at times, most particularly when various philosophical positions were presented and discussed. I failed at times to make sense of some of Gangle's claims. For instance, in the chapter on Peirce, he states that "With triadic signification however, the subjective inner kingdom loses its impermeable boundary and thus its sovereignty. Subjectivity becomes diagrammatic." (p. 130.) Of course, I am not being fair, for this is but two sentences at the end of a paragraph at the end of the chapter on Peirce. It comes as a conclusion to the whole chapter. Still, I fail to really understand how one can say that subjectivity becomes diagrammatic.

Be that as it may, do I believe that category theory and diagrams can be useful to philosophy? Certainly. Does Gangle's book provide an illustration and a useful entry point for philosophers who might want to learn how to use category theory in their own research and thinking? It will depend on their sensitivity to the philosophical issues chosen by Gangle. His presentation of category theory and categorical notational systems are clear and instructive. That will certainly be useful and could be a starting point to non-mathematicians. As to whether, in the end, philosophers will be convinced and will find ways of using these concepts and notational systems in their own philosophical work, I will leave that to readers to decide.