Diagrammatology: An Investigation on the Borderlines of Phenomenology, Ontology and Semiotics

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Frederik Stjernfelt, Diagrammatology: An Investigation on the Borderlines of Phenomenology, Ontology and Semiotics, Springer, 2007, 507pp., $189.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781402056512.

Reviewed by Valeria Giardino, Institut Jean Nicod (CNRS-EHESS-ENS), Paris


Diagrammatology is the product of a very ambitious project: the development of a semiotics based on iconical realism. The book is divided into two parts. The first is devoted to the articulation of the basic tenets of such a realism; the second presents three possible domains of application: biosemiotics, picture theory and literary theory.

The issue investigated in the first part and, indeed, the central theme of the book is Peirce's doctrine of 'diagrammatical reasoning', which mainly includes diagrammatic construction, observation and manipulation. This leads to the introduction of the notion of continuity as discussed by Peirce in his mature work. Stjernfelt tries to show that continuity is indeed at the base of Peirce's attempt at providing a philosophical architecture in which to embed his sign theory. In Chapter 1, Peirce's system is introduced, going back to his interest in the philosophy of mathematics and the role of the continuum in Cantorian set theory, and moving to a metaphysical concept of continuity. According to Stjernfelt, it is possible to consider the whole of Peirce's system through the lens of this concept. First, in semiotics continuity provides an account for general concepts and the relationship between extensional and real reference which is characterised by vagueness and indistinctness. Moreover, in ontology, objects and events are embedded in a horizon continuum of potentiality. Continuity would also be behind the pragmatist notion of truth as that to which the scientific community will converge in the long run, and implies the pragmatist's fallibilism due to its inherent and ineradicable imprecision. Most of all, continuity is central for drawing general conclusions from a diagram, since diagrams, in all cases, involve a moment of observation, which is, according to Stjernfelt, a process necessarily infused with continuity. Perception and knowledge rely on continuous generality, and it is the very continuity of the sheet upon which a diagram is drawn that becomes a matter of central importance. Stjernfelt then analyses the triads and the trichotomies that populate Peirce's philosophy, and discusses his theory of iconicity, including a presentation (and rejection) of both Goodman's and Eco's criticisms of the theory. In Stjernfelt’s interpretation, the icon for Peirce has a non trivial and operational definition: an icon is a sign which can be manipulated in order to learn more about its object than is explicitly present in the sign.

Up to this point, the discussion in the book is very interesting and stimulating, but it loses some of its strength and coherence beginning with Chapter 4. This chapter which, as Stjernfelt emphasizes, is the key chapter and the central node of the book. The chapter is devoted to the general status of the diagram in diagrammatic reasoning and is indeed necessary to refute the approaches according to which on one hand we have diagrammatic reasoning, and on the other everything which has to do with the category symbol. Stjernfelt begins by quoting a long and very important passage taken from the "Prolegomena to an Apology for Pragmaticism" (1906) and tries to track the implications of this passage both for Peirce's philosophy and for the present significance of his views; but the result is not totally satisfactory. Some of the issues discussed are very interesting: the distinction among three kinds of hypoicons, the operational account of similarity, the relationship between new knowledge and manipulations, and finally the analysis of what counts as a 'proper' diagram and of which sources for the transformation syntax are possible. Nevertheless, some of the topics, though stimulating, are not as central as the others (e.g., the example of cartography and the discussion of Hintikka's interpretation of Peirce's distinction between 'corollarial' and 'theorematical' reasoning). Other subjects, such as the comparison with Hilbert's formalism, seem too general.

In the rest of the book, Stjernfelt seems to try to follow out all the developments inspired by Peirce's very suggestive ideas about signs and, specifically, diagrammatic reasoning. In Chapter 5, he provides an overview of types of transformations in some existing semiotic theories such as D'Arcy Thompson’s morphological biology and the views of Lévi Strauss which it inspired. He also discusses Greimas' semiotics, Klein's Erlangen program, cognitive semantics, and recent picture semiotics. In the following chapter, he turns to a comparison between Peirce's approach to diagrammatic reasoning and Husserl's doctrine of 'kategoriale Anchauung' (categorical intuition) and his later doctrine of 'Wesensschau'. Peirce connects diagrams, continuity and generality. According to Stjernfelt, the same kind of relation is reflected in Husserl's idea that in order to grasp ideal objects, a continuous deformation of the object must be performed in an 'eidetic variation'. This comparison is extended also to mereology. Chapter 7 is an even wider discussion of the mereological implications of four major trends in semiotics initiated by Husserl, Jakobson, Hjemslev and Peirce. Each of these has some degree of connection to the Brentanian philosophical tradition from which modern mereology originates. The first part of the book ends with a chapter on the synthetic a priori both in the Austrian tradition to which Husserl belongs and in Peirce, introducing some insights from Barry Smith and Michael Friedman.

As Stjernfelt points out, distinctions such as that between synthetic a priori laws and contingent empirical data can not be ultimately understood by armchair philosophizing but only by a philosophy which engages itself with the ongoing development of the special sciences, and thus with specific regional ontologies. This is why in the second part of the book, he shifts to an investigation of some possible diagrammatic and synthetic a priori regularities in three domains of application: in biosemiotics, which takes at face value the involvement of semiotic expressions in biology, e.g., the 'DNA code'; in picture theory, including both the ordinary sense of ‘picture’, and the sense used by 'picture theorists' in art history; in literary theory, taking into account Roman Ingarden's Husserlian doctrine of the four strata of the literary work.

Barry Smith’s blurb says that after this book's publication, 'diagrams will never be the same'. This is true, to some extent. Indeed, Stjernfelt succeeds in at least two ways. First, he provides a key for an overall treatment of this very fascinating topic which in recent years has been investigated from the points of view of the most different and various fields of research. In doing so, he does not neglect the complexity of the topic but, on the contrary, shows all the different issues that can be connected with or elucidated by it. Secondly, he puts forward interpretations of Peircean semiotics and Husserlian phenomenology that stress similarities between the two, thereby opening up not only a series of questions about the evidence in support of his claims, but also a relatively new perspective that brings closer two traditions which until now have not been treated as deriving from similar ideas. Nevertheless he pays a price for this since the book ends up trying to cover too much, introducing many topics that can't be analysed in depth. Sometimes the book looks like something between a manual about what diagrammatology is and the role it is supposed to play in an epistemological framework, and a historical reconstruction of Peirce's thought. The book also tries to treat discussions from Peirce and to the present of how access synthetic a priori knowledge of regional and formal ontologies (in the Husserlian sense).

In the Introduction, Stjernfelt explains why he chose the title for his book. First, he says that he regards diagram manipulation as a prototype of a wide class of thought processes which have not been recognized earlier. Second, he regards diagrams as a central case of iconicity in general, exemplified by the three applications in biosemiotics, picture theory and literary theory. Concerning the first point, Stjernfelt succeeds in giving a detailed interpretation of Peirce's system and of the role of continuity in it; he also shows plausible relationships to other views, such as Husserl's. Concerning the second point, iconicity as Stjernfelt presents it is too comprehensive to be the subject of just one book. But this inadequacy has a positive side since it creates the conditions for further and exciting new research.