Dialectic of the Ladder: Wittgenstein, the 'Tractatus' and Modernism

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Benjamin Ware, Dialectic of the Ladder: Wittgenstein, the 'Tractatus' and Modernism, Bloomsbury, 2015, 212pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472591401.

Reviewed by Andrew Winer, University of California, Riverside


Late in his illuminating and useful examination of Ludwig Wittgenstein's Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, Benjamin Ware quotes Wittgenstein's assessment of the Viennese house the philosopher designed and built for his sister in 1940, by many lights a modernist masterpiece that Wittgenstein himself deems "the product of a decidedly sensitive ear and good manners, an expression of great understanding (of a culture, etc.)." This pronouncement, and the one that immediately follows and complicates it -- "But primordial life, wild life striving to erupt into the open -- that is lacking. And so you could say it isn't healthy" -- can be seen as emblematic of the sort of two-punch therapeutic wallop with which, on Ware's reading, Wittgenstein intentionally imbued his philosophical writings in general and the Tractatus in particular. The first punch is typically one we can't feel, and in fact functions more like a gentle and comforting stroke that seduces us with that which already feels good and right to us: in this case, Wittgenstein's first statement appeals to our preconceived notions about taste -- it appeals to our investment in manners, sensibility, and culture. But with characteristic self-criticality, and a philosophical penchant for flipping things on us, Wittgenstein adds that the house is lacking life, and so -- here's the second punch -- what we thought were our thoughts, what we took for our values and ideals, is suddenly revealed to be unhealthy.

Intriguingly -- and not just because of its biographical interest, but because Wittgenstein's philosophical method does seem inextricably connected to his subjectivity and to his sensitivity to the world's impress on that subjectivity -- Wittgenstein may have sought to direct this one-two punch at himself, according to Ware, as much as at the rest of us. Ware quotes a rough draft of Wittgenstein's forward to his Philosophical Remarks in which the philosopher confesses, "the fact remains that I contemplate the current of European civilization without sympathy, without understanding its aims if any. So I am really writing for friends who are scattered throughout the corners of the globe" -- a statement that would seem to situate Wittgenstein within a large group of writers for whom modernity was a degenerative assault on the spiritual and aesthetic values of a culture in decline (Ware includes figures such as Spengler, Kraus, and Mann; Zweig, Rilke, and even Henry James could easily be added to the list).

To this cultural picture of apartness and alienation, Ware adds an additional, psychological layer of understanding by bringing in the work of clinical psychologist Louis Sass, who, examining Wittgenstein's early writings (including the wartime notes from the front), finds the philosopher to be at odds not just with his culture but with himself and indeed his own corporeality. While presenting us with Sass's diagnosis of "schizoid" tendencies in Wittgenstein may actually serve to obscure rather than clarify our understanding of Wittgenstein as a philosopher, Ware's mention of Joyce's A Portrait of the Artist as a Young Man, and his quoting of its narrator's description of the artist's defense as "silence, exile, and cunning," go a long way toward helping us to understand Wittgenstein the writer. Sass (and, by implication, Ware?) almost seems to be surprised that Wittgenstein so longed to overcome his feelings of removal -- feelings that, for both Sass and Ware, are characteristically modernist.

But these feelings of apartness aren't exclusive to modernists: they are, in fact, typical of writers period. It's one reason that so many writers throughout history have given expression to a sort of despair about their respective epochs that can seem to us to border on the nostalgic and the conservative, and indeed Ware rightly grapples with Wittgenstein's own sentiments of this nature. Yet it is equally true that many of the very best writers, at least in their best work, overcome and even turn against these proclivities, suggesting that, consciously or not, they are able to tap into their own deepest fears and anxiety, and not only creatively work through them but flip them -- for the benefit of themselves and others. This was as true of Tolstoy and Flaubert as it was for Wittgenstein's fellow and colingual modernists such as Musil or Kafka, and it is precisely this self-overcoming in his work that, as much as any historical proximity, connects Wittgenstein to the greatest writers of his generation or any generation. Ware's is a book with the Tractatus and the modernist era on its mind, and it can't be all things at once, but it could have benefitted from a bit more exploration of this terrain -- the ground on which Wittgenstein and a whole host of writers, not just modernists, stand -- especially in light of Ware's otherwise exciting and conversation-expanding positioning of Wittgenstein as a philosopher whose works are literary and ethical, and even ethical because literary.

Nevertheless, assuming that Wittgenstein did indeed long to surmount what put him at odds with the culture, the main focus of Ware's study has everything to do with a second and much more interesting longing (for us and for philosophy) that Wittgenstein harbored: to overcome the coping strategies that he had developed in the face of his feelings of cultural and worldly exile, or, more to the point, the coping strategies he'd inherited from the culture. Such strategies include renouncing the material world, downgrading the status of the physical (including the body) while simultaneously upgrading the status of all that is nonphysical or metaphysical, and allowing one's dissatisfaction with reality and its appearances to translate into a dissatisfaction with one's language, and, more specifically, with the ability of one's language to capture reality. And it's here that Ware's particular reading of Wittgenstein and his Tractatus proves so helpful and, in places, even electrifying.

Traditional readings of this first masterwork of Wittgenstein's assume that its enigmatic and epigrammatic statements are metaphysical propositions about the nature of reality and language's relationship to that reality. On this view, Wittgenstein claims that there are limitations to what can be put into words, and that we should remain silent about that which is beyond the threshold of language. One problem with this view, as Ware explains, is that such an awareness of a limit of language leads to a desire to go beyond that limit, thus too easily satisfying, as Wittgenstein says, "a longing for the transcendent." Another implicit problem with this traditional view, Ware goes on to suggest, is that language gets sort of "policed" by all who subscribe to the notion of its limitations: there is a point at which its descriptive powers end full stop, and all that lies beyond that point can only be expressed by artists, poets, and any language -- such as that in the Bible -- that employs expressive, that is to say metaphorical, musical and symbolic, means.

It's easy, in light of this view of language's inability to capture a world that can feel complex and scarifying, to place Wittgenstein side-by-side with other modernists like Eliot, who in his career-making poem Four Quartets wrote "Word strain, / Crack and sometimes break, under the burden," or Hofmannsthal, whose famous short story, "Letter from Lord Chandos" -- which dramatizes the narrator's inability to put into words his feelings about a modern, fragmented world deprived of meaning -- continues to this day to appeal to metaphysically-inclined artists and writers. It's easy -- that is, if one reads Wittgenstein as making direct propositions, in his Tractatus, and not pseudo ones meant to lure us in (remember that first punch).

And this is Ware's point: aligning himself, in part, with anti-metaphysical or what he calls "resolute" readers of the Tractatus, Ware takes Wittgenstein's closing exhortations to the reader -- to throw away "the ladder" and view the book's preceding propositions as nonsense -- at face value, or rather Ware takes it in the face, so to speak, honoring the shocking blow (the second punch) that the philosopher intends, on Ware's reading, to deliver to the reader. Having invited us to take on a variety of positions about language that seem to align neatly with modernist views of language's limitations, Wittgenstein, according to Ware, then reveals them to be nonsense -- not because he claims to be able to view language as a whole from some position outside of it (à la Eliot, say), but rather because he has invited us, one-by-one, to occupy the internal logic of these positions, before turning the tables on us in order to bring us to an awareness the problem isn't with words per se, but with our confused relation to them. The Tractatus' effect, then, isn't due to its content so much as its form, and this, Ware beautifully shows, is precisely what puts the Tractatus on literary ground: the book means to awaken us, as a result of our experience of reading it; it's a literary performance that delivers an emotional wallop to the reader who has spent the bulk of the book looking into a mirror reflecting -- in the form of its propositions -- her or his own philosophical hungers.

Among those hungers is not only a desire for ineffable truths but for scientific ideals of precision and progress -- ideals that, in the modernist era (as in ours), can lead one to want to find the perfect words, in the perfect order, on some finite trek toward truth. Such desires for perfection are in part what drove many of the aforementioned modernists towards unease with themselves, their worlds, and the words they used to try to capture that unease. This is why, according to Ware, Wittgenstein structures the Tractatus the way he does, numbering his propositions like some sort of mathematical proof, as if they are leading the reader up some ladder toward a new place: the philosopher wants us to experience making progress, experience what appears to be an extremely ordered work of philosophy, experience the feeling of scientifically proceeding toward truth. That the propositions themselves are written so concisely also gives us the sense of perfection and precision. To then encounter the book's last statements that tell us to throw this structure -- the ladder -- away, and that tell us to consider all of those perfect statements nonsense, is to be put through the experience of awakening from a dream. That dream, as Ware points out, is the dream of traditional philosophy, in which one puts forth theories and builds systems.

And that dream (again, as Ware points out) is the problem. We think we can make progress by theorizing our way to a complete explanation of the world. That Wittgenstein saw this as an illusion is one of the reasons he was so opposed to scientism. The so-called deepest problems of life, in his view, cause us unnecessary anxiety because they are actually pseudo-problems, and, as he puts it late in the Tractatus, "The solution of the problem of life is seen in the vanishing of this problem." Ware's great insight is that Wittgenstein's method of awakening us and effecting such a vanishing is a literary one: we are taken on a journey, with all the sensations of travel, only to find that we arrive where we started, but with a transformed understanding of what the problems of life are. The Tractatus, then, is a literary work that has this ethical effect on us, without recourse to specific ethical language; instead, it relies on an authorial strategy of seduction and then, through its sudden and massive discarding, shock. As Wittgenstein was later to write: "philosophy does not lead me to any renunciation, since I do not abstain from saying something, but rather abandon a certain combination of words as senseless . . . What has to be overcome is not a difficulty of the intellect, but of the will." The Tractatus therapeutically assists us in overcoming this difficulty of the will, so that, where once we were beholden to the ideal, we now stand awake and in possession of what we've always had but were unaware of: ordinary language.

Ordinary language. On this subject, Ware reminds us what Wittgenstein, and indeed any good writer, already knows: ordinary language is capable of infinite complexity. "Everyday language is a part of the human organism and is no less complicated than it," writes Wittgenstein, and we are reminded here of those "good manners" that governed the design of his sister's house, a design in which "primordial life" and "wild life" is lacking. Wittgenstein was in effect reprimanding himself for not using the ordinary language of architecture to capture some of that wildness, just as he means to reprimand and move us, in his Tractatus, if Ware's reading of it is correct: he wants us, at book's end, to arrive back with ourselves, and with language that is already intimately tied to our living selves.

If Ware is right, we might say that Wittgenstein gets to have it both ways in the Tractatus: he gets to work out all of his own metaphysical longings by positing wise, poetical, mystical sayings -- many of which have seduced some very prominent minds over the years and generated great conversations about art versus science, and about description versus expression -- and then he gets to refute them or flip them. There's something very exciting, very liberating, about this picture of a writer having it both ways, just as there's something exciting about Ware's reading of the Tractatus: not the typical closing down of an anti-metaphysical approach, his, but rather an opening up. With Ware's help, we can use the Tractatus to stay light on our feet philosophically, and dance on those ladders that lie to us.