Dialectical Passions: Negation in Postwar Art Theory

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Gail Day, Dialectical Passions: Negation in Postwar Art Theory, Columbia University Press, 2011, 308pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231149389.

Reviewed by Monique Roelofs, Hampshire College


In Dialectical Passions, Gail Day binds the fate of contemporary politicizations of the aesthetic in art and architectural theory to negation's ability to uphold the dialectical movements of critical agency. The book's dense yet lucid argument makes Hegel's conceptual heritage a key to the transfigurative potential that art and aesthetics can contribute to the recent resurgence of Left radical projects. As instances of the current renewal of Left activism, Day cites the 1999 WTO protests in Seattle and the opposition to the invasions of Afghanistan and Iraq. She notes that the beginnings of this shift may already be visible in the 1994 uprisings in Chiapas and the 1995-96 protests in France. The book refreshingly and persuasively holds reflection on art and culture to the task of understanding art's capacities for critical intervention.

The object of Day's analyses is to eradicate theoretical barriers that stand in the way of our answering this challenge, particularly ones that flow from a misrecognition of the possibilities of dialectical processes. The study takes as its most immediate targets discourses about art: Day investigates the operations of negation as an artistic strategy mainly by exploring critics', historians', philosophers', and architects' views; less so by elaborating her own readings of artworks. The book's political exhortation reflects this focus. Pressing categories of art criticism to yield an enlarged understanding of art's politics, the discussion calls on theorists to take up their place in the regeneration of Left social activism. Day offers a philosophically expansive and richly argumentative history of ideas that demonstrates the profound imprint of dialectical thought in aesthetic consciousness and cultural analysis. The book successfully brings together an array of approaches under the heading of negation, reorienting one's map of fundamental themes in aesthetic theory.

Rather than proposing an encompassing definition of negation that unearths a decisive semantic core, delineates a set of epistemological and metaphysical commitments, and spells out the notion's idealist and materialist implications, Day sketches a cumulative picture of variable meanings that the term adopts across cultural debates and in relation to divergent objects of denial. Her approach is designed to acknowledge the complex life that characterizes the concept's functioning in aesthetic discussions. This method leaves philosophical gaps, cutting discussion short on points where further conceptual exploration would help to flesh out important ideas, increase readability, and aid the reader in grasping the specific nuances that the unfolding analyses contribute to the key ideas of negation, mediation, and dialectics. And yet the method is philosophically productive in the sense that it allows for theoretical openness to a wide fabric of conceptual interconnections.

The historically emerging realm of artistic negation that Day discloses involves operations such as distancing, dissolution, opposition, contradiction, and rupturing. It comprises stages of nonidentity, disjunction, abstraction, emptying, and self-consummation. The reader comes to see the dialectics of negation at work in the mining of positive contents on paths of annihilation, the transcoding of signifiers through acts of tropological decomposition and expansion, and other modes of dis- and rearticulation. Day attributes negation's prominent functioning in aesthetics partially to the influence of Left-Hegelian and Nietzschean perspectives, and, quite cryptically, to the position the object of artistic and representational activity acquires under modernity.

Dialectical art and reflection, according to Day, outruns melancholy and quietist nihilism. It averts the repetitive stases induced by oscillations between dualistic oppositions. An affirmative inhabitation of the neoliberal world order is part and parcel of the requisite form of critical mobility. Cognizant of their participation in commodified cultural relations, contemporary practitioners of dialectics confront the devastation wreaked by these systems and actively engage the resulting social disaggregation, without propping up transnational capitalism on the pillars of a seamless, monumental whole. The activity of meeting the negative head-on, in the divergent discourses Day reviews, makes possible a becoming-other, enabling artists and theorists to sustain a mediating movement that escapes closure or fixity. Provoking critical encounters with market formations, a dialectical aesthetic politics of negation provides necessary resources for building emancipatory spaces of resistance. Day repeatedly holds a flattening or halting of negative dialectics responsible for unwarranted foreclosures of social critiques.

Discussions of T.J. Clark and Manfredo Tafuri describe ways in which an affirmative recognition of our embeddedness in capitalism can lay fertile grounds for critical resistance to this apparatus. In Day's reading, Clark, an art historian, ultimately remains skeptical about this outcome, doubting the power of conscious awareness to translate into positive social change. For Tafuri, the architect/theorist who played a prominent part in the Italian workerist movement, an emphatic Nietzschean yes to capitalist destruction -- undergirded by collaborative participation in activist social collectives -- is capable of catalyzing dialectical turnabouts toward a better world in the process of delving into the detritus of urban reorganization and social restructuring.

Shifting to theater and literature, Day examines Benjamin's and de Man's dialectical understanding of allegory and the relation of allegory to the symbol. The work of negation turns out to be at risk in more recent art-historical views of allegory. Siding with Maureen Quilligan, Fred Orton, and Stephen Melville, and challenging treatments by Craig Owens and Douglas Crimp in October in the early eighties, Day contests the elision of negative dialectics in accounts of postmodernism that rigidify oppositions between postmodern allegory and the modernist symbol. Premature closures of dialectics appear to mark also the work of Benjamin Buchloh, Hal Foster, and Frederic Jameson. Day argues that their diagnoses of postmodernity overemphasize social abstraction at the cost of the role of the relations between use value and exchange value and of the workings of use value as a specific social form, functions which, for Marx, emerge from the dialectic between the relative and equivalent forms of value. Attending to crucial aesthetic subjects such as metaphor and cultural memory, the interdependence of anticipatory and retroactive temporalities, the links between sign and reality and between actuality and possibility, the book marshals abundant resources of negative thought in support of a reenergized Left cultural politics.

In the transition between the voices of the theorists under discussion and the book's overall philosophical frame, however, clarity and specificity are lost from time to time. Day's final paragraph cautions against concluding from the ongoing resurgence of politicization in art that "art is the new site of political action; there may well be political effects, but these efforts mostly remain circumscribed on art's terrain" (p. 244). Clearly, the force of this warning depends on how broadly we circumscribe art's terrain. But where does this domain begin and end? Twentieth-century avant-gardes have called into question the possibility of demarcating this terrain. Even if, conservatively, we associate art with museum practices and established institutions surrounding the criticism, curating, reception, and theory of art, the web casts very far. If we include, beyond widely acknowledged avant-gardes, also popular arts, design, architecture, urban developments, and everyday artistic practices, the territory swells yet further. Day's reservation about the effectiveness of art's politicization thus only vaguely gestures toward restrictions facing art's power to bring about social change, without pinpointing what they are or explicating how they arise.

The admonishment to avoid understanding art as "the new site of political action" does not do much to reign in political ambitions bubbling up in the area where art and politics come together, because art may be seen as one among several historically emerging sites of such action that enter into conversation with one another. To speak of the limits of art's terrain, in the tradition of the Marxist critical theory centered by the book, is to allude to the idea of the autonomy of art. A discussion of these boundaries from a perspective on which "the opening lines of Adorno's Aesthetic Theory still haunt contemporary art practice" (p. 7), may be taken to allude to his conception of autonomy. But according to Adorno, a dialectical view of art suggests a twofold picture of art's autonomy as a mobile historical formation that coils into art's social reality. His initial remarks in Aesthetic Theory about the loss of art's self-evidence and the uncertainty that has arisen about art's place in society begin to introduce this notion of autonomy. This idea poses complications for attempts to delineate art's terrain and accords historical contingency a role in the matter. How then, we may ask, do the dialectics of negation, so subtly and far-reachingly traversed by Day, infuse the frame of analysis underwriting her discussion?

Further expounding the need for guardedness in our attempts to comprehend politicization in art, Day claims:

The intensity of this sublimation unleashes immense creativity and productivity, but shorn of a renewal in unified social practice the repoliticization of aesthetics in the twenty-first century has probably achieved all it can, though it often achieves this by pushing at the very limits of its own enclosures. (pp. 244-5)

This declaration gives rise to a host of questions. To what notion of unification does this formulation subscribe? Absent an explanation of how mediation, fragmentation, and antagonism inflect the relevant unity, it is hard to assess what is meant by unified social practice. What is the operative understanding of achievement? What conception of politics is in place that so rapidly registers the realization of an array of completed accomplishments? One wonders why the dialectical lineages Day explores do not invite a more open-ended notion of the political. In an earlier description of Benjamin's turn to commitment and praxis, Day points to the double-sidedness of open negativity, which can advance us toward emancipation or move us toward "torpor, fatalism, complacency, nihilistic quiet" (p. 173). Yet these are not the only alternatives, and a more fine-grained picture of the presence of artistic form and aesthetic experience as constituents of social life (for better and worse) can alert us to a broader field of art's political functioning.

As an example, consider the dialectic of negation in El Anatsui's Ozone Layer and Yam Mound(s), a vast curtain of discarded strips of aluminum liquor-bottle rings, condensed milk tins, and other pieces of scrap metal, draped over part of the monumental fa├žade of a site of aesthetic nationhood, the Alte Nationalgalerie in Berlin, in 2010. Turning upside down and initiating dialectical movements across normalized hierarchies between the useful and the useless, official and residual modes of production and consumption, and effective agency and stagnation, this work can inspire consciousness of Europe's (neo)colonial bonds with Africa and complicate the passer-by's temporal experience of the urban environment. Given that aestheticized structures of subjectivity, national being, and global citizenship carry substantive political weight, artworks can make political effects by taking steps to restructure such dimensions of experience. Modes of negation abound in the work, including the partial cover-up of the building, a shifting of orders of temporality, a palimpsestic distancing and alternative allegorization of historical symbols, and interference in the mediations imposed by the enclosure of a house of history. The work's toppling of hierarchies of productivity invites us to rethink notions of cultural development, efficacy, and modernization. Aesthetic theory should be able to recognize the power of such aesthetic strategies to trigger a reorganization of experience and to invite a questioning, of which the full scope of political effects cannot quite be predicted in advance.

In light of the ubiquity of inextricably entwined aesthetic and political forms such as El Anatsui's, Day's cautionary turn to the notion of sublimation with its traditional connotations of an articulation that distances sexuality, while transcending both productive, commodifiable labor and nonproductive expenditure, reads like an abrupt break with the lexicon of mediation adopted throughout the book. Following discussions of T.J. Clark and de Man, whose views of signification prominently understand politics and ideology to take effect at the level of visual and linguistic form, this term makes a surprising departure from the study's broader tenor, which recognizes multiple, disparate ways in which the social inheres in art's formal constellations. At points such as these, a deeper synthesis of the various positions of critical agency, nihilism, completed nihilism, renewal, and radicalism presented in the book, and a more thorough-going assessment of the implications of these stances for the politics of aesthetics, would assist in elucidating the precise stakes of Day's argument.

Perhaps here we run into a pitfall attendant upon the mobility of dialectical practice. Day illuminatingly points to the coincidence of particularity and generality in discourses of negation and to the ambiguity this permits (pp. 8-9). She indicates that the weight of negation is

on the one hand, both highly specific and context bound, and, on the other, loose and plural; it is both meaning laden and meaning elusive. Its valence shifts from extremely particularized values, which require their specific determination to make sense, to a sort of reified metaconcept (p. 8).

The resulting shiftiness is not something from which we should shrink, according to Day, but corresponds with the transformative passion gushing forth in the shape of negation's vicissitudes:

Like the devil in Thomas Mann's reworking of the Faust myth, values metamorphose before one's eyes -- and they do so not only in the sense of their constant multiplication but also by shifting qualitatively across the registers of general and particular. A local comment swiftly takes on the dimensions of a major social thesis; a minor act of aesthetic transgression magnifies into existential or world-historical significance. Often, general and particular categories are collapsed into a false identity. Nevertheless, one ignores this mutability and ladenness with social value at one's peril (p. 9).

This volatile transmutability may subtend the restraint counseled by the book's final paragraph. Fluid motility runs through dialectical methods. Accordingly, when one finds that Day's vocabulary oscillates between more and less bifurcated understandings of discourse and power, and art and politics, associated with concepts such as metaphor, metonymy, detail, homology, analogy, the "social dimension of cultural forms" (p. 9) and the "social loading of aesthetic categories" (p. 19), and with debates about the nature of ideology and reification, part of what is happening is that one is moving in and out of shifting strata of negative dialectics. As a matter of philosophical method, this alerts us to the potential multiplicity of connections between art and politics, and may even help to keep categories of art allied with their localized operations in artistic production.

Yet, it is worth investigating how the divergent theoretical idioms in which the book casts the links between art and politics bear on one another. To what extent do the different languages (such as those of Clark's notion of aporetically multiplying metaphors, de Man's view of allegory, and a Marxist picture of the relation between use values and exchange values) take similar or distinct aesthetic registers as their object, and to what areas of commensurability or contradiction does this give rise? In leaving such questions substantially aside, Day's account of negation fails to offer principled reasons for believing that dialectics' mutability and transvaluative force is incapable of provoking unforeseeable, contingent aesthetic and political effects that exceed political constraints ascribable to current politicizations of art and aestheticizations of politics. The strictures Day takes to delimit such effects seem to slide back into a division between signification and institutional politics that conceals the subtle interconnectedness of art and social power.

Dialectics of negation can be recognized in writings by Frantz Fanon, Julia Kristeva, Nelly Richard, Homi Bhabha, and Okwui Enwezor, as well as in Kara Walker's silhouette tableaux, Alfredo Jaar's Rwanda project, and Wangechi Mutu's collages. It would be hasty to conclude from the book's virtual omission of male and female theorists and artists of color, its scarce mention of white women theorists, and the near-absence of references to stratifications of race, gender, and coloniality, that such areas of thought and practice, in Day's view, carry little significance in apprehending and supporting negation's role in the renewal of critical agency. Yet the elision of this field of inquiry obfuscates (and perhaps exemplifies) the variegated ways in which dialectical passions have been indebted to uncritical affirmations of problematic social constellations, forms of structural indifference to injustice, and oppressive entanglements of power and knowledge. It calls into question the capacity of shorthand labels such as "emancipation" and Left "radical discourse" to sustain an adequately demanding picture of the political vantage point of her analysis. It enforces an exaggerated gap between art/art theory and the transnational perspectives to which she alludes in brief references to Left social movements. It permits the book's argument to proceed as if articulations of negation transpire in sexually and racially neutral concepts. Insightfully taking on the capitalist world system as the central target of the politicized aesthetics she examines, yet failing to consider how this order implicates registers of coloniality and of racial and gendered embodiment, Day narrows our view of the politics of dialectics in the act of opening it up. At the same time, the book's intricate account of aesthetically crucial critical strategies and concepts puts us in a strong position to push further our comprehension of the dynamics of negation in these neglected zones.