Dialectics of the Self: Transcending Charles Taylor

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Ian Fraser, Dialectics of the Self: Transcending Charles Taylor, Imprint Academic, 2007, 205pp., $34.90 (pbk), ISBN 9781845400453.

Reviewed by Ruth Abbey, University of Notre Dame


This is the fourth monograph in English devoted to the thought of Charles Taylor. Three major features distinguish Ian Fraser's book from its forerunners. Fraser 1) strives to bring Taylor's work into sustained dialogue with Marxism; 2) offers a detailed critique of Taylor's religious views; 3) devotes a chapter to Taylor's most recent work -- Modern Social Imaginaries (2004). 

1) Fraser's choice of Marxism as a foil to Taylor's work is not fortuitous: as Fraser points out, in his earlier years, Taylor was very familiar with the writings of Marx and his more humanistically inclined followers (1-2). Fraser further maintains that many of the aspects of Taylor's conception of the self have links with the Marxist tradition. These include Taylor's social view of the self, his emphasis on self-interpretation, language and dialogue and his depiction of modernity's affirmation of everyday life (4, 8, 10, 13, 16, 154).

However, in this example we also see evidence of Fraser's tendency to over-read the salience of Marxism for Taylor's thinking. Marx was neither the first nor the last theorist of the self as social: Aristotle and Hegel were important figures in this tradition of thinking and both appear to have been more influential for Taylor's thinking on this topic than was Marx. It is a bit of a stretch to find an emphasis on language, self-interpretation and dialogue in Marx's own writings (17). And thirdly, Marx is merely one contributor to the modern tendency to affirm daily life: he is neither the first nor the only figure in this line of thinking. It is not immediately clear why Marx should be prioritized over other thinkers as an influence on these aspects of Taylor's thought.

One of this work's constant refrains is that whatever Taylor might have taken over from the Marxist tradition, he has neglected both the impact of class struggle on the development of history and the contribution of capitalism to human alienation (5, 7, 23-30, 119, 128, 130, 156-157,166-167, 177). While Fraser believes that certain other Marxist elements persist in Taylor's thought, the weaker these become, the poorer is Taylor's political and social theory.

2) Fraser suggests that over time, Taylor's engagement with Marxism waned and he became more explicit that Catholicism represents his "preferred framework within which to pursue the good" (3). However, Fraser also notes that there is no necessary collision between these two frameworks: earlier in his career, Taylor had been described as "a sort of Catholic Marxist" (3), so Catholicism did not have to eclipse Marxism in its influence on his thinking. Whatever its relationship to the role of Marxism in Taylor's thinking, Fraser is extremely critical of Taylor's Catholicism, referring repeatedly to his "restrictive theism" (or some close variation on this wording) (4, 59, 79, 84, 88, 94, 96, 101, 110).

Chapter Two of this work provides a sustained critique of Taylor's short book A Catholic Modernity? (1999). This work provides the fullest statement so far of Taylor's personal religious outlook, and Fraser finds many problems with his statement of belief. As Fraser sees it, Taylor does not practice the openness to other belief systems that he preaches when it comes to comparing Christianity and Buddhism; his idea that theism provides a more robust source for unconditional love is unfounded; his choice of the sixteenth century Jesuit missionary Matteo Ricci as a model for Catholics today is troubling, given Ricci's commitment to conversion rather than tolerance of other religions; and Taylor is ultimately incapable of providing a persuasive account of transcendence.

Fraser is careful to indicate that his critique of Taylor's Catholicism is not based on any hostility to religion, spirituality or transcendence: he is only attacking Taylor's handling of these issues. In Chapters 3-5, Fraser argues that thinkers in the Marxist tradition offer superior alternative ways for thinking about some of the questions of time, death, transcendence, moral and spiritual sources outside the subject, and the relationship of art to the modern identity. Thus Walter Benjamin and Ernst Bloch have better conceptions of transcendence and Theodore Adorno is more helpful in thinking about aesthetics and identity. Once again, the comparison with these figures is not adventitious: they are all thinkers with whom Taylor engages at some point or another. Fraser regrets Taylor's failure to fully exploit the resources they offer for thinking about the questions that concern him. In these comparisons, he sometimes identifies Taylor's commitment to theism as an obstacle to a fuller and more open reading of these thinkers (63, 77, 79, 85, 88, 101). In Chapter 4 he applies this line of argument in his discussion of James Joyce and the idea of epiphanies: Fraser offers a reading of Joyce that emphasizes non-theistic epiphanies and contrasts this with Taylor's more limiting theistic reading of Joyce.

3) The chapter on Modern Social Imaginaries offers a detailed but somewhat disjointed and occasionally repetitious overview of this short work. The account is largely expository, but along the way Fraser chides Taylor for accusing Marxism as a whole of technological determinism, rather than appreciating the more humanist strand of Marxism represented by an historian like E.P. Thompson (115, 127 cf. 20). Fraser also accuses Taylor of uncritical appropriation of Habermas's work on the rise of the public sphere, although the evidence he provides for this doesn't bear out this criticism (132-133). Fraser further criticizes Taylor for understating the role of class struggle in the development of modernity. As part of this complaint, Fraser notes that Taylor ignores the resistance in England to the enclosure movement (133). A little further on he upbraids Taylor for ignoring "minority forces against the juggernaut of the social imaginary of American capital" (143). Yet insofar as I understand Taylor's enterprise in Modern Social Imaginaries, this sort of criticism is beside the point. In delineating aspects of the modern social imaginary, Taylor's focus is on those who have been, for better or for worse, triumphant and he thus leaves behind alternatives that were abandoned or marginalized along the way. Rightly or wrongly, this is not an exercise in subaltern history: rather, it is to the victor the social imaginary.

It is unfortunate that none of the nearly twenty reviews of Modern Social Imaginaries were discussed by Fraser, as some of his questions about what Taylor is trying to do in this work and what he actually succeeds in doing could have been sharpened by encounters with other interpreters. One of the issues Fraser raises has been noted by others -- i.e., what exactly Taylor is referring to when he talks about the modern social imaginary: where do these ideas exist? In the heads of social agents or in the texts of great philosophers? Or both? A related issue is whether Taylor's use of this terminology avoids some of the criticisms leveled at Sources of the Self (1989) for being an overly idealist and top-down approach to history. Fraser mentions some of these problems as he goes along, but as they (and others) have been discussed in previous reviews of Taylor's book, it's a pity Fraser didn't take the opportunity to build on some of the existing responses. He does take up the question of whether a social imaginary can have an ideological function in the Marxist sense, but this potentially interesting line of questioning soon becomes a discussion of whether Marx himself ever used the term "false consciousness" (151). 

The final chapter of this book serves both as a conclusion to Fraser's analysis of Taylor and as a prolegomena to the sort of social and political theory Fraser believes should be written. Fraser continues to defend Marxism against charges from Taylor and to vindicate a Marxist approach to the present. He outlines the beginnings of an "aesthetic self [that] emerges in its dialectical struggles against capital. In doing so, we will not only be transcending Charles Taylor [as the subtitle of this work suggests], but also transcending the constraints of capital itself" (178, cf. 6).

I suggested above that Fraser's book brings Taylor into dialogue with the Marxist tradition. But by the time one reaches this book's conclusion, it emerges that this is a mischaracterization of Fraser's project, for the putative dialogue turns out to be one-sided. The elements of Taylor's thinking that Fraser endorses are, in his estimation, already there in Marxism, so there is little that the living Marxist tradition has to gain from an encounter with Taylor's thought. Taylor becomes the silent partner in the dialogue: his role is to listen and learn (or re-learn) lessons from Marxism.