Dialetheism and its Applications

Dialetheism And Its Applications Book Cover

Adam Rieger and Gareth Young (eds.), Dialetheism and its Applications, Springer, 2019, 176pp., $119.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783030302207.

Reviewed by Riccardo Bruni, University of Florence


Dialetheism (or, more simply, "glut theory" as dual of familiar truth-value "gap theories") is the view according to which there are true contradictions. Quite a hard view to legitimate, which explains why it seems to have only very few genuine supporters. Yet, it is not, or it is supposed not to be, confused with the view according to which every contradiction is true, also known as "trivialism", which entails that there is not even something such as "true" different from "false" and everything is both true and false. To fortify the difference between glut theory and trivialism is possibly even a harder task, especially if one sticks to forms of reasoning somewhat committed to classical logic and the principle of ex-falso quodlibet, that would precisely prevent such a distinction to be made. The debate about glut theory has therefore increased since the study of paradoxes has led to proposals designed to avoid "explosion" of a logic due to the discovery of one (or more than one) contradiction.

The volume under review is an output of the said connection. It is indeed intended to celebrate 25 years since the publication of In Contradiction by Graham Priest, who is credited with giving the first substantial argument for glut theory, and for its defense. (Priest, along with Richard Sylvan, née Routley, coined the neologism 'dialetheism', though there is no similar neologism coined for gap theory.) The aim of the volume is to provide the reader with an idea of how a philosophically dubious view has given rise to a flourishing research area.

I will here follow the editors' own suggestion and see the nine papers the volume contains as grouped into four parts. The first of them, which includes the first two papers of the book, goes back to the very roots of the logical elaboration of glut theory and features attempts to solve logical paradoxes. The second part of the book is devoted to new applications for glut theory, and it includes the two subsequent papers of the volume. The third part features three papers which all focus on, and provide examples of, impossibilities of different kinds. Finally, the last two papers belong to the technical part of the volume and present some formal developments for glut theory.

The first paper, "Liars with Curry: Dialetheism and the Prospects for a Uniform Solution" by Ben Burgis and Otávio Bueno, contains a critical review of the contribution of gluts (dual of gaps) for solutions to logical paradoxes. In particular, the authors focus on whether Priest's particular glut theory contributes to giving the paradoxes a unified solution that could be seen as a realization of Priest's principle of uniform solution (PUS, henceforth): the idea that paradoxes of the same kind should require the same kind of solution. This position is critically argued against here by making use of Curry's paradox (CP) as a case study. The problematic aspect of PUS is of course the notion of "sameness" it relies upon, both for paradoxes and for solutions to them. A discussion is here made about CP being of the same type as the Liar paradox (LP). This is done by analysing arguments proposed to set the difference between CP and LP, none of which sounds conclusive to the authors of the paper. The point, then, is that, granting this thesis, adhering to PUS would require solving CP and LP by the same means, which is actually not the case. A uniform solution for both CP and LP would be to reject modus ponens (MP). This, however, is regarded as a problematic move by many (not all) glut theorists. Even a solution based on the approach by Jc Beall, who has a way to reject MP without preventing us from going deductively from A and A→B to B, is rejected by Priest. Therefore, the authors conclude that either the dialetheist finds an alternative way of rejecting MP that is appealing, or there is no uniform solution for CP and LP to propose, contrary to Priest's claim.

The second paper of the volume, "A Revenge Problem for Dialetheism" by Gareth Young, deals with another classical problem coming from the study of paradoxes. "Revenge arguments" is a label for those paradoxical derivations that take place at the meta-level of any proposed solution to paradoxes, which follow the same "pattern" of the paradoxes that one claims to have solved. Young's paper tackles Priest's claim that Priest's version of glut theory is revenge-immune. Since revenge arguments usually involve the metatheory of a given theory (typically, by applying to semantical notions), the issue is here addressed with respect to a theory with a paraconsistent set theory as a working metatheory. The author argues that, within this setting, the very notion of validity can be jeopardized. Indeed, the glut-theoretic nature of the metatheory forces the supporter of this theory to view invalidity as contradictory. Therefore, there are arguments that are both valid and invalid, which blocks the possibility of speaking of arguments that are invalid only as the glut theorist would like to (for, remember, glut theory is not supposed to be trivialism). The extent of the result can vary. As a matter of fact, arguments which are both valid and invalid in the sense of this paper can be either all arguments, if both the principle according to which ¬A being true implies that A is not true and the corresponding principle for "true in a model" are accepted, or almost all arguments instead (in particular, all arguments except those whose conclusion contains at least a conditional), if those two principles are rejected. In the last section, a few responses are considered, none of which is judged to be of any help for the glut theorist's cause against revenge paradoxes.

The subsequent paper of the volume is the first one of the part of it devoted to new applications of glut theory. Notably, this is a contribution by Priest, whose work in the field the volume is meant to celebrate. Due to the quite unorthodox character of the view, to find instances of true contradictions is as important to the glut theorist as the attempt to provide the view with the appropriate logical foundations. Priest proposes to view the psychological phenomenon that occurs when something is so repellent that it is impossible for an observer to avoid looking at it, as one of such instances. For this situation to represent a genuine example of a (in Priest's words) "psychological dialetheia", an argument is required that: (i) makes clear that the two "forces" it involves, namely, that of "being attracted by" and that of "being repelled by", are contraries (in such a way that the whole situation can be regarded as a "contradiction"); (ii) that the situation referred to by Priest is a combination of attraction and repulsion (so to exclude, for instance, that the observer is attracted and repelled by "parts" of a given object, and, in particular, by different parts of it, which is a case in which one could argue against the fact that a contradiction is really taking place). Priest also considers possible objections to the view, and sketches a possible physical explanation supporting the existence of contradictory mental states his stance seems to lead to.

Next to Priest's contribution is the paper by Sebastiano Moruzzi and Annalisa Coliva titled "Dialetheism in Action: a New Strategy for Solving the Equal Validity Paradox". The "paradox" hinted at in the title is the clash between what the authors refer to as the "law of non-contradiction" (LNC, henceforth), which is the principle according to which propositions p and not-p cannot both be true in the same circumstances, and the quite common situation in which, out of two persons disputing, one of them supports p while the other one supports not-p instead. After reconstructing the argument leading to the contradiction semi-formally, the authors analyse six possible ways out, the last one of which involves the glut-theoretic option of denying LNC itself. This corresponds to p being recognized as a glut (a true contradiction), which leads to the need to address a further issue: if p is known as a glut by the two contenders, then there should be no point in arguing (or, at least, no rational point to raise objections to the opponent), as each would have to acknowledge the other as being rationally justified by the fact that both p and not-p are true. Therefore, the glut-theoretic way out seems reasonable only at the cost of assuming that, if the disagreement takes place, it is because the two contenders ignore the glut-theoretic nature of p. However, this leads to another difficulty to tackle: for, assuming that the two contenders, A and B, are epistemic peers and that A supports p, then the fact that B supports not-p (plus the fact that A acknowledges B as an epistemic peer) should give A the hint that p might be a glut, which would carry us back to the conclusion that arguing would be useless in that case. This problem is discussed by the authors along with another issue that involves trivialism: for, areas and matters of dispute that are prone to be regarded as instances of disagreements of the sort analysed here are so overwhelming in number, that choosing the glut-theoretic solution for them would seem to be like committing oneself to the view according to which a high quantity of, if not all atomic propositions are dialetheia.

Part three of the volume, which starts afterwards, contains the three subsequent papers: Ira Georgia Kiourti's "An Excess of Dialetheias: In Defence of Genuine Impossible Worlds", Frederick Kroon's "Game of Truth: Truth, Fictionalism, and Semantic Paradoxes", and Chris Mortensen's "Dialetheism and Impossible Figures". They are all devoted to finding examples of impossibilities.

Kiourti's paper deals with the concept of impossible worlds and the way in which one might think to extend David Lewis' theory of genuine, concrete possible worlds with their impossible counterparts. Why add impossible worlds at all? This is the question that gets answered first. Impossible worlds could be useful for dealing with impossible propositions that are all treated the same in the standard theory, with no means for distinguishing plain contradictions, like "Red is green", from sentences expressing ideas that one might have entertained for a while, but which turned out later to be unviable, like "The square root of two is rational". In addition, impossible worlds might be useful for providing "counter-possible conditionals", that is, conditionals with an impossible antecedent, with a more specific treatment rather than holding the view that they are vacuously true as they turn out to be on all standard accounts. Upon reflection, Kiourti retains that the most reasonable way to challenge Lewis' own argument for rejecting impossible worlds lies in questioning his truth definitions for logical connectives. Dialetheism comes into play as a tool for giving the objections to such a non-standard approach a "bolder response".

The paper by Kroon on truth, fictionalism and semantic paradoxes aims instead at proposing a new approach to truth as a fictional concept. This combines with a glut-theoretic attitude that takes the inconsistency of truth for granted, and is motivated by the need to retain it nevertheless owing to the usefulness of truth talk in every ordinary context.

Finally, Mortensen's paper on impossible figures is motivated by the observation that the story and the character of impossible figures make it clear that these are not drawn as illusions, nor invented for the sake of illustrating illusory aspects of real objects. Rather, they are intended as genuine impossibilities and can be used to argue that it is possible to have a contradictory visual content, which in turn supports a weak form of a paraconsistent view.

The last two papers of the volume have a more technical character. In the first one of them, "Making Truth Safe for Intuitionists", Andrew Tedder and Stewart Shapiro use glut theory to investigate "recapture" for systems based on intuitionistic logic. "Classical recapture" is the heading under which are identified solutions to the paradoxes of formal truth where a non-classical, weaker logic is needed only to restrict the use of certain classical inferences when the truth predicate is concerned, while all classically valid inferences are admissible for sentences in which the truth predicate is not involved. Recapture results are here sought for in the case of theories built over Heyting arithmetic plus Church's thesis (i.e., the statement that the values of every function can be effectively calculated), which is known to be inconsistent with classical logic. The paper considers how to adapt to the goal a number of approaches that are on the market already: Neil Tennant's Core Logic, David Ripley's cut-free approach, Hartry Field's approach based on system K3, Beall's detachment-free approach and Priest's contraction-free approach. Two plans are considered for adapting these approaches to intuitionistic logic: "plan A" is based upon replacing negation with an intuitionistic one, while "plan B" reaches the goal via a variation on Gödel's translation of S4 into intuitionistic logic. Plan B is required for the systems by Field and Beall that heavily rely upon De Morgan laws, which in turn make plan A unattainable. As far as Priest's system is concerned instead, a more refined approach is needed, as two variations for each plan are sketched as possible options for achieving the goal in this case.

The last paper of the volume is by Guillermo Badia and Zach Weber with title "A Substructural Logic for Inconsistent Mathematics". If there is a place where one would not look for inconsistencies, this should be in a mathematical structure. Yet, in the spirit of the kind of investigations that the disclosure of paraconsistent logics has led to, the idea that the inconsistent is not worthy of a mathematical analysis has been challenged (for instance, by N. Da Costa, who gave birth to the exploration of "paraconsistent mathematics"). Part of the motivation comes from the history of mathematics itself, which is full of examples of inconsistencies, like the naïve set comprehension axiom. To recover the mathematical significance of it is the ultimate goal of the paper: a base theory for the working glut-theoretic mathematician is built by equipping light linear logic with a negation symbol satisfying the De Morgan properties, as well as with a relevant conditional. The system does not validate contraction, so paradoxes are avoided. This allows one to formulate extensionality safely in this context. The expanded system is also proved to be a conservative extension of the system without the conditional. Finally, a naïve set theory is built upon it, and shown to provide a foundation for induction owing to constructions based on the existence of highly impredicative (i.e., circularly defined) sets. A proof of the non-triviality of the theory is lacking, but is under consideration for future work.