Dialogues with Davidson: Acting, Interpreting, Understanding

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Jeff Malpas (ed.), Dialogues with Davidson: Acting, Interpreting, Understanding, MIT Press, 2011, 481pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780262015561.

Reviewed by C. G. Prado, Queen's University


This is an impressive collection, though one defying brief review. It consists of an illuminating Foreword, a clear, stage-setting Introduction, twenty articles in three topical sections, and an extensive Bibliography. The orientation of the collection turns on Jeff Malpas' attempt to cast Donald Davidson's work as broader than the narrowly analytic corpus many take it to be: e.g., Ernest LePore. (xviii) Another collection in this vein, to which I refer below, is Ludwig 2003.

Two comments on the orientation before turning to the articles: first, no one, including the philosopher in question, can legitimately limit interpretation of and extrapolation from a philosophical corpus. Second, that said, I had the privilege of meeting Davidson and commenting on his "A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs" two years before its publication. (Queen's University, 9/27/84).  I drew a parallel between him and Gadamer that Davidson resisted. He seems later to have changed his mind to some extent, but I suspect he would be ambivalent about several of this collection's articles, despite their being as intellectually productive as they are convincingly supportive of Malpas' view of Davidson's work.

I proceed by saying a bit about each article and more about those I found most interesting. I will say now that this is a book anyone interested in Davidson should own.

A preliminary point: the collection's articles are "dialogues" with Davidson; discussion of his work in relation to continental thinkers is not about one-way or reciprocal influences but about parallels in philosophical thought. It is one thing to draw parallels, though, and another to exploit them: a difference evident in the more and less successful articles.

Dagfinn Føllesdal's Foreward provides a succinct overview of Davidson's views. His tactic is to compare Davidson with his teacher, Quine, indicating how Davidson went beyond Quine. Føllesdal then touches on hermeneutics and Gadamer, and though the Foreword ends somewhat abruptly, he makes intriguing reference to Husserl being wrongly read as a foundationalist -- a reading later used in the anthology. The Foreword succeeds admirably in setting the scene for the articles that follow.

Malpas' Introduction is brief; he was no doubt conscious of the length of the collection, but might usefully have amplified a little. Nonetheless, he clearly lays out the raison d'etre of the volume, which is "appreciation of the significance of Davidson's work as it extends beyond the narrowly analytic." (xix)

Richard Rorty's article, the first in the "On Language, Mind, and World" section, is only three and a third pages long. It was originally a Boston Globe obituary for Davidson and, sadly, Rorty was too ill prior to his death in 2007 to expand or rewrite it. (xv, xxv) The article thus serves more as homage to Rorty than clarification of Davidson's thought because it offers nothing new. Fortunately, Rorty's views are discussed in various other articles. Note that this is the only previously published piece in the collection.

David Couzens Hoy and Christoph Durt's "What Subjectivity Isn't" contends that Davidson's "revision of the Cartesian conception of subjectivity changes much of what philosophers can say about the mind." (7) The authors' approach may have been too ambitious and the result falls short. Discussions of Davidson and Husserl, and to a lesser extent Gadamer and Heidegger, read more like exposition than fruitful connection. Readers familiar with Davidson will likely find the coverage of Husserl unproductive if not immaterial. Other than by parallel, there is no connection between Davidson and the article's conclusion that "phenomenology presupposes hermeneutics." (24)

Samuel Wheeler's "Davidson, Derrida, and Differance" provides a useful review of Davidson on truth. With respect to Derrida, the article's main effect, which may or may not have been Wheeler's intention, is to show Derrida's understanding of truth to be more interesting and deeper than most analytic philosophers think. He does this partly by dispelling the apparent disagreement between Derrida, who "takes a dim view of 'truth,'" and Davidson, for whom truth is central. (31)

Gordon Brittan's article, "Davidson, Kant, and Double-Aspect Ontologies," compares Davidson and Kant in addressing the issue of anomalous monism. This paper raises the bar regarding conceptual difficulty by focusing on Davidson's notion of anomalous monism or the claim that mental events involving propositional attitudes "are token (as opposed to type) identical with physical events (monism), and that there are no strict psychophysical laws (anomalousness)." (Ludwig, 19) Brittan makes an absorbing attempt to deal with the inconsistency of three intuitions affecting Davidson's claim: (a) that mental events sometimes cause physical events; (b) that laws link causes and effect; and (c) that no laws link mental causes to physical effects. (45-47) These intuitions run very deep and involve unalterable factors such as that we explain human actions by giving the reasons why they are done, the very idea of responsibility for action, and that desires and beliefs are defined by the behavior they produce. (46) Additionally, Brittan considers Davidson's claim that we can, in some cases, describe the same events in mental or physical terms. (50-51)

Richard Manning's "Interpretive Semantics and Ontological Commitment" offers a review of analytic philosophy's diverse camps: deflationists and theorizers. In the first camp we find "postpositivists like Quine . . . [and] neo-late-Wittgensteinian and Austinian 'ordinary language' types" and others. In the second camp are "neo-Thomistic metaphysicians . . . [and] philosophers of language as different as Lewis and Dummett" and "right-wing" and "left-wing" Sellersians. (61-62) The contrast basically is of anti- and pro-Kantian philosophizing: repudiation or commitment to "the idea that philosophical reflection itself can reveal substantive truths about the world; the idea that such truths are necessary; and the idea of a fundamental or deep ontology." (64) Where does Davidson fit? Manning argues that while the apparent answer is that Davidson is a postpositivist following and building on Quine and belongs in the anti-Kantian first camp, a more holistic appreciation of his work puts him in the pro-Kantian second camp. Manning's argument is persuasive to a point, but as he himself characterizes the two camps, they offer a typology of analytic philosophy. (64) In light of the other papers in the collection, Davidson merits being considered as having gone beyond the principles and commitments Manning uses to characterize the deflationist and theorizer camps.

Mark Okrent's "Davidson, Heidegger, and Truth" asks whether there is truth without thinking beings; specifically, is there more to truth for Davidson than his Tarskian analysis admits? Might Davidson have embraced Heideggerian truth-as-revelation/disclosure? Exposition of Davidson and Heidegger, especially of Davidson, is too repetitive. In the end, Okrent thinks Davidson unable to embrace truth-as-revelation/disclosure because of "the limitations of his vision and philosophical upbringing." (109)

Giancarlo Marchetti's "Davidson and the Demise of Representationalism" offers a rehearsal of Davidson's and Rorty's contentions against representationalism; it offers nothing new nor does it consider interesting alternatives such as John Searle's. Moreover, given the previous six articles, exposition of Davidson is increasingly tiresome at this point.

Bjørn Ramberg's "Method and Metaphysics: Pragmatist Doubts" focuses on the metaphysical and "ametaphysical" sides of Davidson's thought to better understand "the metaphilosophical divergences . . . between a naturalistic pragmatism and contemporary analytic metaphysics." (129) For Davidson, how a theory of truth for a language reveals that language's structure recasts metaphysics "as the explication of the ontological commitments we must undertake as we develop a recursive theory capable of specifying the truth conditions of any of the . . . many assertive sentences of a language." (130) Roughly, the ametaphysical hitch is that successful communicators must share a largely true picture of the world and untranslatable conceptual schemes are ruled out; objective error can only occur "in a setting of largely true belief." (131) Davidson does not allow enough of a possible difference between "what we have reason to believe and how things really are." (132) Ramberg next considers pragmatism and uses Rorty as well as Davidson's "passing" and "prior" theories, deciding that while the metaphysical and ametaphysical aspects of Davidson's thought are basically compatible, "The real battle concerns how to understand Davidson's claims about the meaning-constituting role of reason, the social nature of thought, and the veridicality of belief." (141)

Lee Braver's "Davidson's Reading of Gadamer" begins the "On Interpretation and Understanding" section, and is "a kind of 'autopsy' on what could have been a productive dialogue" between Davidson and Gadamer. (149) Braver shows how Davidson misread Gadamer due to assuming they had the same understanding of "dialogue." (149) The article complements Ramberg's treatment of Davidson's narrow view of perspectival differences and exhibits the "hermeneutic humility" Braver attributes to Gadamer, because with little change the piece could be a damaging critique of what emerges as Davidson's parochial interpretation of Gadamer, an interpretation that excludes interaction with texts from triangulation. (158) As Gadamer reminds us, "it is more than a metaphor . . . to describe the task of hermeneutics as entering into dialogue with the text." (152) Davidson's understanding of dialogue effectively rules out the role of deep cultural and perspectival differences in communication, reducing "all cognitive differences between cultures and times to a matter of marginally disparate distributions of truth conditions." (152) The positive nature of Braver's piece is evident in his trying to show "where history and culture could enter Davidson's system." (155)

Robert Dostal's "In Gadamer's Neighborhood" has two hard acts to follow. We again get exposition of Davidson and Gadamer, the rejection of representationalism, and truth as revelation or disclosure, but in more comprehensive terms. What is most interesting about the article is that Dostal has the mettle to conclude that while Davidson and Gadamer end up in the same neighborhood, they "do not reside at the same address" due to reaching their agreement on interpretation "by very different routes": Davidson following Quine and Gadamer following Heidegger. Dostal concludes, "One might be tempted to say that their accord is not philosophically interesting." (182)

Jonathan Ellis' "The Relevance of Radical Interpretation to the Understanding of Mind" is a welcome shift of focus, raising the question: "If radical interpretation is not a situation we typically or ever find ourselves in, why should consideration of what we would do in that situation yield insights into the nature of belief?" (198). Ellis points out that as Davidson moved away from his view that "All understanding of the speech of another involves radical interpretation," the grounds for his constructivist understanding of belief evaporated. (198) Ellis believes that "radical interpretation . . . entails nothing at all about what beliefs are" and hence Davidson's philosophy of mind has no adequate basis. (202) Briefly, the Davidsonian constructivist view may be adequate to attribution of beliefs but is inadequate to proper understanding of what it is to have beliefs.

Barbara Fultner's "Incommensurability in Davidson and Gadamer" shows the efficacy of Gadamer's notion of "horizons" for dealing with elements operant in interpretation, such as cultural and historical differences, that Davidson underestimates or fails to deal with adequately. Gadamer's understanding of perspective is "grounded in the phenomenology of hermeneutic experience rather than being formal or conceptual in nature as is Davidson's," hence Gadamer replaces unacceptable conceptual schemes with mutable interpretive or perspectival horizons. (224) In this way, Gadamer is able to "deny incommensurability" with Davidson without denying that "there can be significant differences between cultures and individuals." (225)

David Vessey's "Davidson, Gadamer, Incommensurability, and the Third Dogma of Empiricism" falls short of being productive, beginning with a description of Gadamer's views as "less well known" and requiring "more argumentative reconstruction than Davidson's." (242) This depends on your perspective. Generally, Vessey's efforts to dispel a "common misunderstanding of Gadamer's views" to facilitate comparison with Davidson's on incommensurability seem needless. (245)

Malpas' "What is Common to All: Davidson on Agreement and Understanding" focuses on the social nature of thought and language and on misreadings of Davidson as presupposing some conventional or conceptual shared basis for interpretation and understanding. (Note: a useful summation on pg. 260, beginning "One simple way . . . ," has something of a double negative (against/cannot) that is confusing.)  Malpas stresses that Davidson rejects "a way of thinking about agreement" that grounds it on "an essentially subjective, even if shared, structure . . . prior to any encounter": a prevalent way of thinking that often distorts reading of Davidson. (261) For Davidson, what enables social thought and language is "agreement consisting in our dynamic, active engagement with a set of worldly events and entities." (262) The misreading of Davidson is also common regarding Gadamer, a misreading of which Davidson himself is guilty. (266) Malpas goes on to suggest that in at least one later paper Davidson himself seems to slip into assuming a shared structure. (271) This is a productive article calling for careful consideration.

Giuseppina D'Oro's "Davidson and the Autonomy of the Human Sciences" is the first in the "On Action, Reason, and Knowledge" section. The articles in this section are broader in scope than those in the previous two. D'Oro argues that the "ontological backlash against the linguistic turn spelled the demise of a conception of philosophy as high-level conceptual analysis and of the concomitant understanding of the challenges facing anyone intent on defending the autonomy of the Geisteswissenschaften." (283-84) She describes as "Davidson's undeniable merit" his sustaining "a kind of nonreductivism that is grounded in a distinction in kind between normative and descriptive sciences, rather than in a distinction in degree between sciences with greater or lower predictive power." (284-85) D'Oro proceeds with a perceptive consideration of anomalous monism.

Frederick Stoutland's "Interpreting Davidson on Intentional Action" is an over-long, over-noted effort to "pry Davidson's account of action apart from the standard story" and defend it against criticism more appropriate to the standard story that actions "are those bodily movements caused and rationalized by beliefs and desires." (318, 297) I found much of the discussion unnecessary. The treatment of Anscombe's influence on Davidson is the best part of the piece but is mainly of historical interest. The article is marred by distracting overuse of emphasis. Gilbert Ryle once told me there's no need to shout; he was right.

Gerhard Preyer's "Evaluative Attitudes" focuses on their place in Davidson's thought. Though interesting, too much of the paper is preparatory discussion and too little productive proposals or conclusions. Preyer thinks that, regarding value in the social sciences, "Davidson provides us with a way of seeing how values necessarily enter into social scientific inquiry" without impugning "the objectivity of such inquiry." Preyer sees this as "a direct consequence of the fact that evaluative attitudes, and the concept of desirability to which they are inevitably connected, are learned and are meaningful only in relation to particular contexts of behavior and social interaction." (338) Unfortunately, as Preyer admits, Davidson does not adequately allow for, much less deal with, varying cultural and perspectival factors. (339)

Stephen Turner's "Davidson's Normativity" centers on the implications, interpretation, and misinterpretations of "The Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme." The discussion of Davidson's rejection of incommensurability is perceptive and thorough and the treatment of misinterpretation of Davidson's argument will prove helpful to many readers. There is, though, an unfortunate and no doubt unintentional consequence of considering the common inclination to postulate a shared, somehow inherent basis for communication and interpretation. The consequence is that while one is left feeling the force of Davidson's rejection of such a basis, as of incommensurable world-views, one is also left feeling that Davidson gives cultural and perspectival differences very short shrift.

Louise Röska-Hardy's "Davidson and the Source of Self-Knowledge" is carefully done and admittedly expository. (372) However, the paper is overlong and repetitive. More important is that while there is ample discussion of Davidson's account of expressions of self-knowledge, the author never comes to grips with the absence in his account of an adequate treatment of what prompts "dualists" to posit states to which expressions of self-knowledge seem clearly to refer: there is no coming to grips with the persistent question of what it is to have states of which we have self-knowledge.

Sharyn Clough's "Radical Interpretation, Feminism, and Science" is a productive consideration of Davidson on interpretation and evaluative assertions, a consideration enhanced by a useful comparative discussion of Harding. Clough draws out two key implications for "feminist science studies" from Davidson's understanding of radical interpretation. The first is the antirelativist consequence that "the meaning of our beliefs must in principle be available from the radical interpreter's . . . perspective, no matter how different the social locations, worldviews, or standpoints." The second is the equally important consequence that "there is no principled difference in the triangulation process by which we form beliefs concerning basic descriptive features of the world and beliefs concerning evaluative features of the world." (419)

In sum, Dialogues with Davidson is a book worth having and most of the articles repay careful reading. It is a book that will prove useful both to those who know Davidson's work well and to those who want to know it better.



Ludwig, Kirk, ed., 2003: Donald Davidson, Cambridge University Press.