Indian Philosophy in English: From Renaissance to Independence

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Nalini Bhushan and Jay L. Garfield (eds.), Indian Philosophy in English: From Renaissance to Independence, Oxford University Press, 2011, 644pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199769254.

Reviewed by A. Raghuramaraju, University of Hyderabad


A poet, Rabindranath Tagore, was invited to deliver the inaugural Presidential address to the Indian Philosophical Congress; an Indian philosopher, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan, recognized for his work on the subject, was chosen as the President of India, the country's highest office. If this had happened elsewhere, it would have become a rallying point for a detailed discussion, and several works in the form of scholarly deliberation would have decorated the academic space. Different dimensions of this happening would have been elucidated and discussed. This did not take place in India. The poet's humble, wise and fascinating address to the Congress has long been forgotten; and despite the global acclaim of Radhakrishnan, philosophy in India did not subsequently make a mark.

The discussion did not take place because these are not even recognized as events nor were they at least later reckoned as historical facts. Once the facticity is recognized then there is a possibility of discussion. One might ask, does the invitation to the poet reflect the generosity and open-endedness of the philosophical discourse, or does it disclose a lack of internal resources forcing a borrowing from outside. Similarly, does the choice of philosopher reveal the respect India shows to the philosopher or the dearth of resources from the political arena?

Indian Philosophy in English: From Renaissance to Independence, edited by Nalini Bhushan and Jay L. Garfield, makes available Indian philosophy written in English during the first half of the twentieth century. This naturally prompts one to ask, what kind of philosophy is it? Is it different from others? If yes, how? All these issues can be discussed. The major contribution of this volume lies in making available a large body of philosophical writings in English by Indian philosophers written during the late nineteenth and early twentieth century. This facilitates the possibility of a further discussion in this area. There are many authors, including Daya Krishna, who have complained that Indian philosophy is not considered or recognized as philosophy by western philosophers without putting together the writings on this subject from the nineteenth and twentieth century. It remained a complaint and did not lead to any fruitful discussion or debate. It follows, therefore, that there are three stages -- the complaint, the evidence for the complaint and the judgment or correction. The present volume largely fulfils the second stage. The third stage is still wide open.

Another important aspect of this volume is that it is an answer to a provocation by Daya Krishna. In a personal interview to the editors he declared that anybody "who is writing in English is not an Indian philosopher." (p. xiii) The editors apparently have taken it as their primary task to show how this view of Daya Krishna is 'deeply mistaken'. They have, instead, claimed that "the intellectual agency and creativity in the domain of Indian philosophy in the nineteenth and early twentieth century belongs to Indian thinkers; they sustained the Indian philosophical tradition and are the creators of its modern avatar." (p. xiv) Shifting the agency from authors to the readers they, however, agree that though

Daya Krishna may indeed have been wrong about the state of philosophy under the Raj, he gets something deeply right. He correctly characterizes the experience of Anglophone Indian intellectuals under colonial rule when he says in the same interview, ". . .The deepest anguish of the Indian intellectual is that he is unrecognized in the West as an equal, or as an intellectual at all." (p. xiv)

So, this is an important body of work, but it is a tragedy that it is not recognized. Highlighting the importance of this body of work, the editors claim that these

philosophers wrote in a context of cultural fusion generated by the British colonial rule in India. They were self-consciously writing both as Indian intellectuals for an Indian audience and as participants in a developing global community constructed in part by the British Empire. They pursued Indian philosophy in a language and format that could render it both accessible and acceptable to the Anglophone world abroad. In their attempt to write and to think for both audiences they were taken seriously by neither. This predicament and this anguish inspire the present volume. We begin by considering the context of Indian academic philosophy. (p. xiv)

Against this background, the editors republish a "small selection" from a "vast literature", important philosophical essays "written by major figures of this period". These essays though long forgotten are nevertheless "present in the historical consciousness of most Indian academic philosophers". (p. xv) In bringing out this selection, the editors seek to "reinvigorate interest in the philosophy of the Indian colonial period, and to demonstrate that Indian intellectual history is a history of active, creative engagement both with its own past and with the intellectual currents of the broader world." (xv). The volume includes the editors' general introduction together with four other essays written by the editors: the first essay in Parts One and Four, and the last essay in Parts Two and Three. In these the editors at times provide the larger context and at other times claim the contributions of these philosophers.

Part One, "National Identity", has essays by Rabindranath Tagore, Aurobindo Ghosh, A. K. Coomaraswamy, Lajpat Rai, Bhagavan Das and K. C. Bhattacharyya. This collection reveals the divergent views of these philosophers on the idea of nation. Tagore, while expressing apprehension about the desirability of nation, particularly the modern western ideas of nation, cautions against its extension to Indian society. He is perhaps one of the few who detected the provincialism behind the veil of this modern political ideal's universalism long before Martha Nussbaum, Partha Chatterjee or even Dipesh Chakravorthy. He boldly declares that nationalism is a "great menace". Aurobindo makes a claim for a "reawakening" of the Indian past in relation to modern knowledge and ideas. He thereby rejects the idea of reversal which is contrary to progress and growth. Repudiating the identification of India with spiritualism, he admits that spirituality "is indeed the master-key of the Indian mind", but clarifies that "this was not and could not be her whole mentality, her entire spirit". For him, "spirituality itself does not flourish on earth in the void, even as our mountain tops do not rise like those of an enchantment of dream out of the clouds without a base." (p. 42) He takes this opportunity to correct the existing version of Indian spirituality as maya vada that is bereft of materialism. Instead he proposes a version of spiritualism that includes materialism and proposes the doctrine of lila vada.

In contrast to these two views that are apprehensive about the homogeneous nature of the idea of nation, Coomaraswamy makes a case for a nation that requires a "unity of some sort", a strong "national consciousness" and "a geographical unity, and a common historic evolution or culture" (p. 69). Circumventing the possibility of communal trajectory that this recalling the past might lead to, Coomaraswamy claims the "Mohammadan" rule as part of this past (p. 72). In an interesting essay, "Reform or Revival?" Lajpat Rai declares that they in Punjab are "prepared to take . . . inspiration from both" though they "prefer to begin with the latter and call in the assistance of the former mainly to understand and explain what is not clear and ambiguous in the latter." (p. 84)

The last two essays in this section deal with swaraj. While Bhagavan Das's essay clarifies the meaning of swaraj, Bhattacharyya's well-known essay proposes a new idea of Indian identity, whose appraisal of the other should reveal Indian cultural aspects, thus contributing to a different understanding of the other. Though each author in this section gives a different version of looking at India's past, what is common to all of them is that they do not endorse, despite their clear criticism of the West and its modernity, isolating India from the rest of the world. Rather, they contribute to its participating in the global discourse.

The next part has essays on aesthetics, which in the India of this period is closely interwoven with political and nationalist claims. Coomaraswamy's essay, like the earlier one, insists on "common past and common art", and rejects the West and its modernity, particularly its impact on Indian art. The next essay by Aurobindo dwells on the future predicament of poetry. Tagore's essay, referred to right in the beginning, is the inaugural Presidential address to the Indian Philosophical Congress. It highlights the close relationship between poetry and philosophy. He points out how in India "poetry and philosophy have walked hand in hand" and explains how this activity goes beyond the textual and literary domain and includes the oral traditions. As opposed to the culture specificity of aesthetics, B. K. Sarkar explains the "universal laws of rasa-vidya" (p. 192). The next essay, by Bhattacharyya, elucidates the Indian concept of rasa. The two essays by M. Hiriyanna highlight the unique aspect of Indian aesthetics: the continuity between nature and beauty; beauty and the ultimate goal of life; and the moral dimensions of aesthetics. In the concluding essay of this part the editors bring into discussion the work of Indian artists, including the works of the Bengal school, Raja Ravi Varma and Amrita Sher-Gil, to establish the relation of Indian art to western art and to highlight the unique features of Indian art.

Part Three includes essays on Vedānta, whose place in Indian philosophy has given rise to serious claims and counter-claims. The first essay, by R. D. Ranade, takes up for elaborate discussion the issue concerning the idea of ultimate reality in the Upanishads. Like Bhattacharyya in the next part, he brings in this context the problem of the unknowability of the self in Kant. Distinguishing the sense of unknowability in Kant and Spenser, Ranade claims that the unknowability in the Upanishads is to be understood from the "standpoint of philosophic humility" (p. 263). The second essay, by Vivekananda, too claims that "what Advaita says is that God is more than knowable." This is not the same as unknowability as used by agnostics. (p. 315). The other essays, by A.C. Mukerji, Ras Bihari Das, S. S. Suryanarayana Sastri, V.S. Iyer, and P.T. Raju, bring out various other aspects of Vedānta including consciousness, causality, freedom, and skepticism. This part ends with an essay by the editors. In this they "explain how Aurobindo's lilavada interpretation of Vedānta made so much sense in India at that time as a vehicle for modernity." (p. 435) They argue how, with the advent of colonialism, Indian philosophers neither retreated into the classical sastras to claim Indian identity, nor did they go all out to embrace modernity. Instead, they "developed an altogether different approach to modernity. They erected a metaphysical foundation that at once unifies a modern vision of India with a classical tradition and breaks with that tradition to forge a creative vision of future philosophy." (p. 436)

This is undertaken by Aurobindo by replacing maya vada with lila vada. Sankaracharya, the leading proponent of Advaita Vedānta, employed both the terms maya and lila. However, Aurobindo, for the sake of contemporary requirement "elevate[s] . . . second . . . as foundation for modern Indian philosophy" (p. 439). Reorienting Vedānta "from the transcendent to the immanent", he thus facilitates its "discourse to enter . . . modernity." (p. 449)

The next part has essays on two other aspects of philosophy, metaphysics and epistemology. The first essay in this part, authored by the editors, highlights the neglected work of Mukerji, and the other essays included are by Hiralal Haldar, Bhattacharyya, Hiriyanna and G. R. Malkani, on themes such as realism, idealism, and truth. The concluding part has in it one of the most lively discussions, "Has Aurobindo refuted Māyāvāda?" Participants in this fascinating discussion include Indra Sen, N. A. Nikam, Haridas Chaudhuri and Malkani.

Now that this volume has made these works available, it is necessary to evaluate them against global or local standards, or even consider them as historical requirements etc. This will be an extension to the editors' laudable contribution. These works with evaluation can find a place in other selections thereby enhancing their importance. For instance, one could ask, like Aurobindo who called for reawakening the Indian past, whether the philosophers in the West made a case for the reawakening of the traditional Greek past with the advent of modernity. If they have, who are they and what did they do? If they have not, why not? Has not the tradition in the West tamely surrendered to modernity? In other words, what is the difference between the successes of modernity in dealing with its own tradition and other outside traditions? The other way of underscoring the importance of the present volume is by listing similar attempts made earlier in bringing together the works of contemporary Indian philosophers including: Contemporary Indian Philosophy, edited by S. Radhakrishnan and J.H. Muirhead, Spirit of Modern India, edited by Robert A. McDermott and V. S. Narvane, and other such volumes to establish a scholarly connection to the already disconnected discourse.

Along with the interesting events of a poet giving the first presidential address to the Indian Philosophical Congress and a philosopher becoming the President of India, one can see how in India you have a philosopher, Vaddera Chandidas, the author of Desire and Liberation: The Fundamentals of Cosmicontology, who is also a well-known Telugu novelist, a combination of philosophy and creative writing that is very rare except as found in those like Sartre. The other interesting coincidence is that while Indians have taken to writing in English in responding to modernity, Descartes, the father of modern philosophy that projected universalism and rationality, chose to write in French, his native language. Further, we might ask why so much is made about what is said in an interview by the editors. Did Daya Krishna seriously argue this view in his written works? In other words, is there a variance in the seriousness of Daya Krisha and the editors?

This volume is a significant contribution to the projection of contemporary Indian philosophy. It circumvents the danger to Indian philosophy, particularly the classical versions remaining in isolation. I recommend this rich and comprehensive volume to all those interested in knowing how Indian philosophers re-wrote their ancestors and responded to the outsiders.