Differences: Rereading Beauvoir and Irigaray

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Emily Anne Parker and Anne van Leeuwen (eds.), Differences: Rereading Beauvoir and Irigaray, Oxford University Press, 2017, 280pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190275600.

Reviewed by Jennifer McWeeny, Worcester Polytechnic Institute


An edited collection that considers Simone de Beauvoir and Luce Irigaray together in comparison has been a long time coming. The juxtaposition is fecund for many reasons, but especially because these two feminist icons are tied to separate periods in the history of twentieth-century French thought and their philosophies are differently positioned in regard to existentialism, phenomenology, psychoanalysis, deconstruction, and the work of other thinkers such as Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Karl Marx, Sigmund Freud, and Judith Butler. Beauvoir lived from 1908-1986 and published her most famous works in the heyday of existentialism and phenomenology in post-World War II France of the 1940s and 50s. Irigaray was born in 1930 in Belgium and published her major writings post-1968, in the currents of French poststructuralism and postmodernism fomenting in the 1970s and 80s.

At first glance, it may seem that Beauvoir's conception of womanhood is aligned with phenomenology's emphases on the humanistic values of subjectivity, freedom, and universalism, and Irigaray's is premised on an irreducible (sexual) difference that derives from ongoing material, discursive, and symbolic processes.[1] Will women find liberation in affirming their equality to men or their difference from them? Insofar as the debate is framed in this way, Beauvoir and Irigaray appear to fall on opposite sides. Looking closely, however, we soon see that things are not so simple. Moreover, the question predisposes us to a naïve answer, since it fixes limited options that ask us to reduce the role of ambiguity in Beauvoir's and Irigaray's respective philosophies. Developing a more nuanced and multi-dimensional approach to this high-stakes intellectual rendezvous is the task of Emily Anne Parker and Anne van Leeuwen's fine collection.

The book consists of eight essays split between two sections. Part I, "Rereading Beauvoir," mobilizes the comparative context to extend or problematize traditional readings that locate Beauvoir's feminism in the tradition of humanism. In Part II, "Rereading Beauvoir and Irigaray," we find explicit comparisons of Beauvoir and Irigaray in relation to themes such as ontological ambiguity, sexual desire, sexual violence, ethics, and logic. The editors, who each contribute an essay to the book, have assembled an impressive group of A-listers in Continental feminisms as the authors of the six other chapters: Alia Al-Saji, Penelope Deutscher, Sara Heinämaa, Gail Weiss, Debra Bergoffen, and Dorothea E. Olkowski.

That the book's title and section titles emphasize the practice of "rereading," that is, reading again or reading differently, and not reading tout court suggests that common interpretations of these thinkers will neither be rehashed nor hastily embraced by the contributors. Instead, readers are promised new encounters with the philosophies of Beauvoir and Irigaray respectively and collectively. In the introduction, the editors suggest that one way to open this fresh territory is by acknowledging, paradoxically, that the two philosophers are similar because they are both "thinkers of difference" (p. 3). Rereading Beauvoir's and Irigaray's concepts of ambiguity and sexual difference with this possibility in mind discloses a fundamental resonance between them: rather than corral the complexity of woman's ontology to one side of a dichotomy, their philosophies recognize both individuality and sociality, freedom and constraint, language and body, and being and becoming. The book's approach also complicates assumptions about the thinkers' respective relationships with psychoanalysis, suggesting that Beauvoir may be more amenable to its insights and Irigaray less so than is often recognized. The call to reread these women is welcome and timely, and appropriate to any philosopher from an underrepresented group whose scholarly reception has suffered historically due to a failure on the part of readers to expect their work to be as important, prolific, and in need of sophisticated interpretation as a (white) man's.

The editors claim that by employing the strategy of rereading certain "obvious and well-established" limitations of Beauvoir's and Irigaray's philosophies may be overcome, thus revealing the relevance of their ideas for contemporary feminisms (p. 2). Specifically, they are referring to Beauvoir's centering of white, European bourgeois women's experiences in her theories and Irigaray's exclusion of women of color, queer women, and trans individuals insofar as she proposes "the [white] heterosexual couple as the fundamental model of intersubjectivity" (p. 3). The introduction moves too quickly here in taking these criticisms of Beauvoir and Irigaray for granted without detailing who makes them and without reviewing which ideas and texts are most susceptible to them. As a result, this crucial point reads as a caricature of the two philosophies (akin to the equality-difference frame that the book finds problematic) rather than as a fine-grained summary of the relevant critical scholarship. The associated claim that both philosophers are "classical second-wave feminist thinkers" (p. 2) should also be better substantiated, since it banks on an implicit understanding of the divisions between waves as well as an assumption that the time of thinking must be linear--that a philosophy or a politics could not turn out to be ahead of or behind its own time.[2]

The eight chapters in Differences are each outstanding essays in their own right (nothing less would be expected given the list of contributors), and readers will find much satisfaction by diving into the particular philosophical questions and strange juxtapositions offered by the individual chapters. These include hermeneutical questions about how best to understand key concepts in either thinker's oeuvre such as ambiguity (Parker, Heinämaa, Weiss, Olkowski), life (Al-Saji, Deutscher), and temporality (Al-Saji, Deutscher, Heinämaa); and questions about how Beauvoir's and Irigaray's ideas do and do not speak to issues in modern-day feminisms like commodification (van Leeuwen), violence against women (Bergoffen), racial difference (Al-Saji, Parker), and desire (van Leeuwen, Weiss, Bergoffen).

Parker's consideration of Beauvoir and Irigaray in light of Audre Lorde's philosophy of difference in chapter three, and Deutsher's analysis of Beauvoir's descriptions of women's affects in The Second Sex in conjunction with Elizabeth Wilson's "gut feminism" in chapter two are exciting moments where the book's promise to engage its focal figures in new dialogues is duly fulfilled. Van Leeuwen's chapter, which asks us to reconceive dialectical materialism in the context of globalization, likewise stimulates fresh perspectives. Bergoffen's chapter is also important for thinking about the feminist movement holistically and cross-generationally because it recasts a central issue of twentieth-century radical feminism, namely, violence against women, through an innovative reading of Beauvoir's and Irigaray's views. Those chapters that take up themes of ethics, ambiguity, and immanence that we have seen before in the existing scholarship are executed with such rigor and acumen that it is as if the issues are presented anew (Al-Saji, Heinämaa, Weiss, and Olkowski). For example, Heinämaa's essay contains one of the clearest and most interesting interpretations of The Ethics of Ambiguity that I have seen in the literature.[3]

Unfortunately, space does not permit a more detailed assessment of individual chapters, but one of the philosophical threads running between the chapters that sparkles for the reader like a coin at the bottom of a pool is the consideration of materiality and/or materialism of one kind or another. This thematic concentration yields the beginnings of what is certain to become a vital debate within twenty-first-century feminisms. Chapter one by Al-Saji, titled "Material Life: Bergsonian Tendencies in Simone de Beauvoir's Philosophy," puts the The Second Sex in dialogue with those theories recently dubbed "new materialisms" that affirm and articulate the active, productive, and agentic aspects of matter. Deutscher's chapter incorporates this agentic conception of matter and expands upon it through an investigation of the expressive and affective bodies of women, construed not simply as symbols or conduits for thought but as a mode of thinking in itself--"gut thinking" (p. 78). In chapter four, "We Have Always Been Materialists: Beauvoir, Irigaray, and the Specter of Materialism," van Leeuwen articulates a different sense of "new materialisms" in the context of Marxist politics, and in particular through Marx's descriptions of a "nonsubjective subject" of politics, one that is not necessarily transparent to itself (p. 115; see also Bergoffen, p. 200).

Both van Leeuwen and Heinämaa are wary of the new materialisms referenced in Al-Saji's and Deutscher's chapters, the former because these theories seem to affirm "the very form of vitalism that is the spontaneous ideology of capitalism" (p. 130) and the latter because bodily experience should be understood separately from "neo-Spinozist philosophies of materiality" (p. 139). Al-Saji's analysis of Beauvoir's use of the trope of life to racialize Arab and Muslim women also demands that the projects of new materialisms be carried out with a critical approach that is cognizant of the ways life, agency, and matter can be differentially applied across bodies (pp. 46-47).

The theme of materiality surfaces still in other ways throughout the collection, such as in Parker's contention that Beauvoir's notion of ambiguity entails the affirmation of bodily particularity and bodily difference, which is also a foundational premise in Heinämaa's and Weiss's chapters. Additionally, Bergoffen argues that, beyond Beauvoir's theory of womanhood, it is "Irigaray's materialistic psychoanalytic critique of the masculine colonization of female desire" that brings us to an analysis of sexual violence capable of recognizing important differences between violence against women and violence against men (pp. 198-199). Olkowski's chapter, chapter eight, articulates how Beauvoir's and Irigaray's philosophies challenge the binary logic of the excluded middle, and respond differently to the Freudian idea that energy and materiality flow within a closed system (p. 235). That four of the eight chapters undertake a rereading of the "Biology" chapter in The Second Sex, and three question the primacy Irigaray affords to heterosexual difference further underscores the book's emphasis on rethinking the bodily, the material, and the biological.

Given the prominence of references to materialisms and materiality in the collection, I wonder if Differences is the best title for this book--if the concept fully does justice to the exciting, avant-garde work taking place therein. Beauvoir's and Irigaray's respective philosophies of difference are only explicitly discussed in two of the eight chapters (Parker, Weiss), and most of the contributions explore similarities between the two philosophies, not differences. The differences thematic seems more suited to framing feminist trends in the 1990s rather than those of the twenty-first century, especially considering that an explicit aim of the text is to move beyond "rutted" dichotomies like equality/difference (p. 196).

The book's structure is somewhat unorthodox, and this feature plays into what insights the text leaves its readers. A standard comparative format would have each of the eight chapters focus on both Beauvoir and Irigaray in equal amounts. In Differences, the first two essays address Beauvoir's philosophy exclusively, and leave it implicit as to how their content is relevant both to Irigaray and to the conversation between the two women. Moreover, the remaining chapters (with the exception of Bergoffen's and Olkowski's) spill the most ink on Beauvoir, often adding one section at the end of the piece to draw the connection to Irigaray. This disproportionate emphasis on the two philosophers renders it less clear what contribution the chapters make as an aggregate in addition to their obvious value as a collection of individual meditations on either Beauvoir or Irigaray. This point is not necessarily a criticism as the absence of a central theme between the chapters compels the reader to read actively and think deeply about the myriad ways they do and could speak to one another. Furthermore, the feeling of moving through the chapters non-linearly and without symmetry is a lot like the feeling of entering into the complexity of Beauvoir's and Irigaray's thinking, so in this sense the structure of the book reflects its content.

Curiously, the weighting that favors Beauvoir throughout the book is reversed in the book's introduction, which situates the book within recent scholarship on Irigaray but neglects to do so thoroughly in regard to current trends in Beauvoir studies.[4] This editorial choice is perhaps an attempt to bring more balance to the attention given to each figure overall, but the task is too important to leave to a few mentions in the individual chapters (pp. 61, 142). A renaissance in Beauvoir scholarship has been mounting over the last twenty years due to a combination of three factors, among others: (1) the release of formerly unpublished or untranslated manuscripts, (2) the widespread recognition of the serious limitations of both English translations of The Second Sex, and (3) the movement to recover Beauvoir's rightful place as a philosopher from the sexism that has historically surrounded the reception of her writings.[5] As a consequence of these trends, there is growing demand for holistic and systematic considerations of Beauvoir's oeuvre as opposed to scholarship that analyzes a few passages from The Second Sex in isolation. Some of the authors in Differences explore lesser-known texts by Beauvoir or Irigaray with precision: Parker's treatment of "An Eye for an Eye" and "Pyrrhus and Cineas," van Leeuwen's analyses of L'Invitée and All Men Are Mortal, Bergoffen's references to Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche, and Olkowski's discussion of "Is the Subject of Science Sexed?" are especially admirable. Al-Saji's and Deutscher's inclusion of original French terms and modifications of translations where needed are also helpful. And yet, as a whole Differences does not make the use it could of current innovations in Beauvoir studies in particular. For example, attending to the recently released collection of Beauvoir's Feminist Writings, which contains "Brigitte Bardot and the Lolita Syndrome" (on male desire) as well as essays written in the 1970s and 1980s, would likely deepen the comparison between Beauvoir and Irigaray.[6]

While Differences fulfills its promise to be cutting-edge in terms of its engagement with new materialisms and topics like affect, temporality, and desire, its overall treatment of some other issues in twenty-first century feminisms, such as intersectionality, critical race theory, queer theory, globalization, activism, and coalition politics, is thinner than is likely warranted. More in-depth conversation with the list of new concepts in feminism mentioned in Parker's chapter--"cisgender, neurotypicality, settler, cortico-visceral ability, neoliberal fluency, citizen, creditor"--would have better revealed the present-day relevance of book's content (p. 91). Finally, the international diversity of the contributors and of sources referenced is a key merit of this collection, spanning Australian-, Nordic-, and Canadian-based theorists as well as those from the U.S. Employing an even broader notion of international in these respects would likewise serve the book's purposes well.

Despite these few ways that Differences could have gone further with its own project of rereading Beauvoir and Irigaray in a contemporary context, this collection has many strengths that render it an important and timely book in the fields of feminist philosophy and French philosophy. Once the equality-difference debate of the 1970s is left behind (as well as the 1980s and 1990s versions of identity politics that are likely its progeny), we are able to achieve more nuanced understandings of the thinking that underlines French feminism in its many manifestations and as it is articulated by Beauvoir and Irigaray. Though radical, these are not rogue thinkers; their philosophies grow from the traditional feminist methodologies of centering the consideration of women's experiences in philosophical thinking and raising consciousness by questioning status quo assumptions about sex and sexuality. They also flow in the stream of a French lineage that eddies around the desire to move from but also ultimately beyond Descartes by reconceiving the bodies that we are without the assumptions of the mind-body, sex-gender, and nature-culture distinctions (p. 10). If a central insight of twenty-first century feminisms is that sexism takes root not merely in discourse, concepts, and laws, but in our very bodies and ontologies--in the structures of our experience and in the fabrics of our emotions, affects, and drives--then phenomenological and psychoanalytic analyses, and the meetings and dissonances between them, are of the utmost relevance to contemporary feminisms. This book also serves as a much-needed call for scholars working in Beauvoir studies and Irigaray studies to expand their ranges and bring these philosophers into more diverse conversations to better reveal how their thinking is both situated in time and timeless, capable of speaking directly to the most pressing issues of our day. In short, the taste of the Differences leaves the reader thinking of the next meal, wondering where these exciting new flavors will lead.

[1] In the introduction to Differences, the editors refer to Margaret Whitford's discussion in The Irigaray Reader (Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell, 1992), which takes work by Naomi Schor and Judith Butler as representative of this standard reading. Other authors relevant to this conversation include Moira Gatens, Tina Chanter, and Silvia Stoller.

[2] For a critical discussion of common conceptions of the phases of the women's movement and categories of feminism, see Chela Sandoval, Methodology of the Oppressed (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 2000), 41-65.

[3] Heinämaa's reading emphasizes that Beauvoir's descriptions of character types such as the serious one, the nihilist, and the adventurer refer to different ways of negotiating existential ambiguity and paradox (pp. 145-151). Heinämaa does not state this connection, but her interpretation makes visible that Beauvoir uses the same approach in The Second Sex when she considers several different character-based strategies for negotiating sexist oppression, including motherhood, love, narcissism, and mysticism.

[4] Only two sources on Beauvoir are cited: a 1979 article by Margaret A. Simons and a 2012 article by Kathryn T. Gines.

[5] As evidence of this renaissance, four edited collections (including Differences) and two monographs on Beauvoir were published in 2017. These include Bonnie Mann and Martina Ferrari (eds.), "On ne naît pas femme: on le devient. . .": The Life of a Sentence (New York: Oxford University Press, 2017); Laura Hengehold and Nancy Bauer (eds.), A Companion to Simone de Beauvoir (Malden, MA: Blackwell, 2017); Karen Vintges, A New Dawn for the Second Sex: Women's Freedom Practices in World Perspective (Amsterdam: Amsterdam University Press, 2017).

[6] Simone de Beauvoir, Feminist Writings, ed. Margaret A. Simons and Marybeth Timmerman (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2015). See also the other volumes in the seven-volume Beauvoir Series edited by Margaret A. Simons and published with University of Illinois Press.