Difficult Atheism: Post-Theological Thinking in Alain Badiou, Jean-Luc Nancy and Quentin Meillassoux

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Christopher Watkin, Difficult Atheism: Post-Theological Thinking in Alain Badiou, Jean-Luc Nancy and Quentin Meillassoux, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 281pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748640577.

Reviewed by John D. Caputo, Syracuse University and Villanova University


Being an "atheist" is not a simple matter. When Derrida says that there are "theological prejudices" imbedded in "metaphysics in its entirety, even when it professes to be atheistic", he means that when metaphysics poses as the supreme authority that pronounces "there is no God," it simply reenacts the role of God. It leaves the "center" standing and reoccupies it with other metaphysical pretenders to the throne: Man, History, Science, Reason, any version of Žižek's "Big Other." That is nothing more than a palace coup that leaves the palace system standing. Such atheism, which a lot of us would call "modernist," Watkin says, "imitates" theism and is "parasitic" on the very framework it purports to negate. Atheism, he argues, is "difficult," a difficulty Nietzsche proposed to meet when he said "God is dead," where "God" meant not just the Deity but the whole system of "values," of "truth" and the "good," from Plato to the present, every attempt to establish a center, a foundation of knowledge and morals, including modern physics, which is also an "interpretation." Watkin thinks this atheism is exposed to a "difficulty" of its own, which he calls its "ascetic" approach, because it calls upon us to make do with the resulting debris or "residue" of lost foundations (the "death of God"), to live with finitude and imperfection, giving up on a satisfying transcendence and putting up with an unsatisfying immanence (133). It does not really annul the place of God but merely leaves it empty (6-7), like Camus' "absurd man" shaking his fist at the void. This is an atheism that regrets that it is right.

The ascetic version faces a further difficulty: once we undermine foundations, we have undermined any foundational argument against the old God. That binds the hands of atheism, preventing any knock-out atheistic blow, thereby leaving the barn door open to religious faith. Kant was being a perfect Pauline-Lutheran Protestant when he said that he found it necessary to delimit knowledge in order to make room for faith. The "difficulty," in short, is that atheism needs foundationalism to cut off the escape route of faith, but foundationalism reenacts and repeats theism. Either concede our irreducible finitude, which leaves the infinite inaccessible and a possible object of faith, or somehow scramble over to the side of the infinite and cut off the escape route of faith, which runs the opposite risk of playing God. That explains "post-secularism," the postmodern "return of religion": once modernity is delimited and the metaphysical gunfire over God subsides, a postmodern version of classical religious faith is free to raise its hoary head. This "colonisation" of modern atheism by religion has particularly gotten Watkin's goat (239).

Watkin proposes a way out of this dilemma -- if not, we will never be rid of religion and all its resulting woes -- under the name of what he calls a "post-theological integration." This means, in Lyotard's words, inventing a new ("post-theological") game and not being content with a new move in the age-old game (theism versus atheism). Is there a way to think "after God" or "without God" that does not act as if it is God (parasitism), while not giving up on the ideas of truth and justice (asceticism), meaning that it can be "integrated" with ideas normally associated with God? (13) A lot depends on what Watkin means by "integration," which runs its own risk of aggression and colonization -- playing with religion and explaining it to itself. Philosophy (father) knows best, knows better than religion what religion is talking about. Philosophy knows that things would be "better" -- it's the "consensus" (239) -- "without" God and religion. A lot also depends on "without," a venerable word of Meister Eckhart's Latin (sine) and German (ohne) vocabulary, meditated upon at length by Heidegger and Derrida (sans). When it comes to being an atheist, who is without sin (sine peccato, anamartetos)?

Watkin takes up Alain Badiou ("axiomatic atheism"), Jean-Luc Nancy ("atheology") and Quentin Meillassoux ("divine inexistence"), each of whom he thinks has just such a post-theological project in mind. The French focus omits not only Nietzsche but also Žižek, but it has the advantage of including Nancy -- instead of simply writing off deconstruction as (like God) dead and restricting the debate to the new or "speculative" realists -- along with a brief but illuminating discussion of Jean-Luc Marion. The problem is interesting, the question is very nicely framed, and the architecture of the book is impeccable (without sin). We can be especially grateful to Watkin for providing exemplary expositions of these authors, especially Nancy, an exceptionally elusive and allusive writer who requires a reading in French. The book is filled with subtle and complex commentaries to which no review can do justice. Difficult Atheism represents a sophisticated contribution to the debates that have arisen in the wake of the "theological turn", and it merits careful study by anyone interested in these issues.

Badiou's attack is directed against "ascetic" atheism, postmodern post-Kantian skeptics about "truth." His atheism is straightforward: theism is false; atheism is true. The dichotomy stands and one branch is broken off. By insisting upon our "finitude," the postmoderns allow the "infinite" (God, the One) to flourish like a poisonous mushroom in the dark soil of the "inaccessible." So Badiou reclaims the infinite for philosophy, stiffens the spines of the philosophers about truth, leaving the old God nowhere to hide while affirming truth and justice. Nothing is left over; nothing can escape the light of the Idea. This is done by invoking a specific version of set theory which wrests the infinite from the One of the Platonic-Christian tradition and transfers it to multiplicity. But, Watkin points out, Cantor was a Roman Catholic who distinguished a numerical infinity (the transfinite, quantitative multiplicity) from the "absolutely infinite" being of God (divine simplicity), which is neither numerically finite nor numerically infinite and as such the province of theology. There is nothing in mathematics which authorizes mathematics to speak about what is not mathematical to begin with. That is the very move Badiou wants to cut off. All Badiou can do with Cantor's distinction is to brush it off and declare "The One is not" an axiomatic decision (27-29). Ontology just is mathematics, adopting a posture often struck in Vatican encyclicals and in the Bible belt under the name of the "Word of God."

Nancy directs his attack against the sort of straightforward modernist or "imitative-parasitic" atheism we see in Badiou. As a deconstructionist, Nancy undercuts the "binary opposition" between theism and atheism (132), treating atheism as the flip side of onto-theo-logy. Theism and atheism are mirror images. He situates himself on the terrain of the "finite," which helps us avoid pretending that we are God, as Badiou has done. That is why Nancy speaks of a deconstructive "atheology," not "atheism." Nancy describes an infinite "open" which is only ever partially filled by any finite construction, an unbounded "sense" which cannot be saturated by any determinate "signification." There is no ahistorical arche or telos that shuts down or "axiomatizes" the open. The notion that something ahistorical breaks in upon the historical and henceforth changes everything -- the way the matheme ruptures the mytheme for Badiou -- is the very gesture of "Christianity," of the Incarnation, or what Nancy calls the "Christmas projection" (37). So it is Christianity that needs deconstruction.

But to deconstruct something is to open it up, not close it down. Deconstruction is un-closing, dis-enclosing. While Nancy's deconstruction of Christianity will give no comfort to the Vatican or Nashville, it will expose a sens deep within Christianity that "Christianity" (a signification) tends to close off. As Derrida points out, that attaches hyperbolic importance to Christianity itself, culling the wheat from the chaff, the spirit from the dead letter. This is made clear by the history of Derrida's word déconstruction, which translates Heidegger's Destruktion, which in turn translates what Luther called the destructio of medieval metaphysical theology in order to recover the pristine heart of the New Testament, which itself translates apolo in I Cor 1:19, which translates Isaiah 29:14. Heidegger's Destruktion retrieves the truth (aletheia) in metaphysics from which metaphysics itself is barred. Watkin concludes that Nancy's deconstruction is "parasitic" upon Christianity and not genuinely post-theological (39-40). Neither Badiou nor Nancy escapes parasitism. Each one convicts the other.

But is not Nancy's "repetition" of Christianity without Christianity exactly what an "integration" ought to be? Might we not distinguish a flat-footed parasitism from an ironic, conscious and creative one? Is there not an illusion embedded in speaking too strongly of the "post"-theological as if the theological could be over and done with? We cannot pull ourselves up by our own bootstraps and create de novo. We begin where we are, with the languages and traditions we have inherited, which we seek to re-think and re-open. The idea is not to decontaminate ourselves from these traditions but to transform them, to recover what is going on in them, without being trapped by them. Sometimes Watkin speaks of the post-theological as if "God," "theology" and "religion" were like AIDS, and the post-theological question is how we wipe out this threat. The post-theological is said to "reoccupy" and "integrate" with theology in order to subvert it.

Is philosophy then aggression, a force of "occupation," a hostile military takeover which "exploits the resources" of religion (99)? That would succeed only in being "integrated" with theological imperialism! What is the difference between the "post-secular colonisation" of atheism and the "post-theological occupation" of theology -- other than whose side one is on? Or is philosophy a repetition that will always be hyperbolic about something -- otherwise it would be "ahistorical" -- writing sous rature, deploying paleologism and a logic of the sans (Derrida's religion sans religion), as Watkin explicitly points out (79-80)? That is a much more delicate operation than the one Watkin ascribes to Badiou -- as if religion were an object exposed to the light of the Idea and the "philosopher" were the "master" who can explain religion to itself, while mocking its self-understanding as a mere "fable." But any idea, "theological" or "post-theological," is at odds with itself and is moved by its own internal tensions. A deconstruction tracks the way things are always already invaded by their other, always divided internally, but it is not exploitation, aggression, occupation, a plundering of religion or the work of art -- merci à Dieu!

At this point, Watkin is convinced we have reached a draw: neither position has found its way clear to post-theology. Badiou makes a primal decision about the axiomatization of being, declaring that the One is not, which even if historically "motivated" is a contestable faith that mathematical thinking is "better." Nancy is likewise unable to escape the shadow of theology, distinguishing a determinate belief (croyance) in a determinate "principle" (or signification) from a deeper but divided faith (foi) (in sens). This faith is not opposed to reason but is a keeping faith with or being "true" (treu) to reason that supplements reason. Reason needs such faith in order to function, given its own insufficiency, so that reason is never more "reasonable" than when it recognizes that it needs the supplement of faith. A self-sufficient reason is idolatry; true reason is unclosed, incomplete, insufficient, exposed to faith (115-16). Nancy calls this "atheology," the affirmation of the unprogrammable, un-axiomatizable, sens of the "world." But this, Watkin thinks, only continues to privilege Christianity. Atheism may be not only difficult but "incompletable" (121), led back to a Gödelian place: atheism cannot complete itself (Badiou) without becoming inconsistent, and it cannot be consistent (Nancy) without being incomplete (123).

Enter Meillassoux, who claims to provide an atheism both consistent and complete. Using Badiou's critique of finitude, Meillassoux attacks Kantian "fideism" (denying knowledge to make room for faith) and gives philosophy unlimited authority over God, rationalizing revelation -- not eradicating it -- not unlike Spinoza or Hegel. Philosophy denies both the transcendent God of theism and the God-less immanence of atheism, but in its place it produces a new God of its own construction, an "inexistent" God. Philosophy is not experimental science, whose methodological limits (finitude) play into the hands of religious faith, but neither is it classical metaphysics, which posits a necessary being. Hence it assumes a "speculative" form which denies the assumption that we are forced to choose between the contingency of the many (postmodernism) and the necessity of the One (God) (metaphysics). Readers of theology will notice that "voluntarist" or "divine will" theology, God as necessary, transcendent and inscrutably free to alter the laws of nature and morality, does service for "God" at large for Meillassoux. The "speculative" position is to assert the necessity of contingency, the necessity that everything is contingent, which Meillassoux calls the principle of the "factial" (le factual). It cannot be that the contingency of things is itself contingent.

This principle is argued for by an odd sort of tables-turning method of "conversion" (162). A minus (reasoning to a necessary being falls into infinite regress, explaining one contingent thing by another) becomes a plus: this failure is a direct insight into the non-necessity of any one being and of the necessity of the contingency of every being, which eliminates the need for faith (146). Being unable to come up with a sufficient reason for any being is an insight into the impossibility that any particular being could be necessary (147). What's ultimately "wrong" with God for Meillassoux is that we are forbidden to ask where God came from. Or again: the "strong correlationists" maintain that reality could always be otherwise than the way we have constructed it in language or consciousness. That is not the skeptical relativism it wants to be, but an intuition that it is inescapably necessary that things could always be otherwise than they are.

Finally, his amazing reading of Hume: the inability to find the necessary relationship between the antecedent and the consequent is an intellectual insight into the real lack of causal necessity, thereby switching the "non-reason" from us (skepticism) to the things themselves (realism). Meillassoux is not saying that the natural world is chaotic but that it is subject to a non-observable (speculative) contingency (143). There are laws and regularities and even causal connections in nature, but they are all contingent. Gravity is a law, but it is not necessary. It is thinkable that tomorrow there will be no gravity. Chaos is disorder, but radical contingency is a "hyperchaos," meaning that disorder may be destroyed by order just as easily as order may be destroyed by disorder. From the principle of "insufficient reason" (there being no sufficient reason for any particular thing) we can conclude to the necessity of contingency (145) and to the principle of non-contradiction, for if a thing were both itself and its contradiction it would already be any "other" that it could become; it would then be an unchangeable and necessary being. But every being is contingent.

None of this means that Meillassoux is done with God. Far from it -- he is the most "aggressive" (231-32) of all when it comes to post-theological "integration." After dispensing with the God of the ontological argument, God as an ens necessarium, it remains possible that God might happen to come about, even if God happens not to exist now. God's current inexistence does not exclude a possible future existence. Indeed, it is absolutely necessary that God (like everything else currently inexistent) might possibly exist later on. Why Meillassoux would ever be led to say such a thing -- he is nothing if not bold -- brings us to the question of justice, the other idea (along with truth) with which post-theology wants to "integrate itself," and to the age-old problem of evil. Justice demands we supersede both classical theism (because it affirms a God who permits the worst injustices) and classical atheism (because it allows the injustice done to the dead to go unrepaired) by positing the hope for the possible emergence in the future of a God who will raise the dead and reward them for their hitherto unrequited suffering by way of a Christ-like figure called the "Child of Man." Like an odd Hegelian, Meillassoux wants to "occupy" everything that (the Christian) religion has to say! That yields a "philosophical divine" (207), a God, religion and resurrection in which we may hope strictly within the limits of reason alone, of the principle of necessary contingency.

Watkin thinks that Meillassoux's principle of the necessity of contingency undoes itself. Given the unbroken rule of contingency, any such necessity would have to be temporally qualified as "according to the presently prevailing standards of rationality" (151). Maybe tomorrow morning what is judged rational or just today will be judged irrational and unjust, while what is irrational and unjust will be judged rational and just. The very notions of thinking and rationality, of necessity and contingency are all contingent and subject to change in the future. If they are not, then they are necessary and exempt from the principle of the factial. Meillassoux either erects a God-like idol out of thinking and rationality (parasitic atheism) or requires an act of faith that reason will not mutate under the force of hyperchaos (ascetic atheism) (155).

In Nancy, justice comes down to a "call" that for Watkin is too weak to be effective and to be effective would require miming a divine injunction. Badiou tells us his view of justice is motivated by his personal experience of the events of May, 1968, which compares to his view that his axiomatic decision to say that ontology is mathematics is motivated by the demands of modernity; while biographically interesting, this lacks the universality politics demands. Badiou bases his atheism on an axiomatic decision; Nancy builds faith into the very idea of reason; and Meillassoux, resisting both moves, attempts a demonstration of his founding principle, but the demonstration requires faith. Taken together, all three thinkers posit an axiom, a call or an intuition in which we must just have faith (233-34), which are considered eo ipso "good" and are given a pass on having to further justify themselves. He concludes with Fichte's remark that the kind of philosophy one chooses depends on the kind of person one is. Philosophy always risks such circularity, which is the ultimate difficulty in becoming an atheist.

But what goes around comes around. Watkin worries that the "colonisation" of atheism by "post-secular" theology ends us up back in theology, not atheism. That is evidently bad because, well, atheism is "good." But what is so good about atheism? Why is atheism not just as good-and-bad as theology, where it all depends upon how theologians and atheists behave both as thinkers and social agents? Why should we seek a "post-theology" that purges both the imitation and the residue of theology from atheism? Because atheism is good and a radical clean-sweep atheism is even better. The "post" in Watkin's post-theology is like Žižek's reading of the Hegelian dialectic as a double no: atheism means no God; post-theology means no God, not even a trace of God.

But why is "post-secular" theology not "good?" It belongs to a progressive wing of theology eager to absorb the insights of radical thinkers from Nietzsche to Žižek in order to engage in serious self-criticism and to undermine the demonization of atheism by theology. If we criticize theologians for not reading such writers, are we then to criticize them when they do? Postmodern theology results in a searching criticism of the violence and fundamentalism of religion from within theology itself, which is vastly more effective than any external criticism of theology. If we test the idea on Watkin's terms, by its pay-off in terms of justice, post-secular theology enacts an auto-deconstruction of theological imperialism, militarism, patriarchy, racism, and homophobia, drawing upon a theology of peace and justice stretching from Amos to Martin Luther King (which is why religious people are so regularly found working among the most destitute people on earth) and calling down upon itself the fire of conservative religious authorities. If such theological thinking were the coin of the realm in religion today, religious violence would not be in the headlines.

That being said, I do in part share Watkin's concern with post-secular theology, although that may come as a surprise to him, since Watkin numbers me among the post-secularists he criticizes, which I attribute to a rather glancing look at my work. I regard the "post-Kantian" version of postmodern theology as an attenuated or abridged edition of postmodernism; it is good but it could be better. It regards postmodernism as the contemporary version of "apologetics," cutting off reductionistic critiques of religion and allowing classical religious orthodoxy to stand untouched. A more searching version of postmodern theory requires a more searching (and post-Hegelian) criticism of what is going on in religion and theology. That requires a careful historical and critical study of the Scriptures, of the history of theology and of what we are talking about when we westerners speak in Christian Latin of "religion." The result would take the form, in my view, of an exposition (an expounding and an exposing) of the "events" that take place in religion -- events of promising and hoping, giving and forgiving, mourning and recalling, justice and hospitality, and the like. It would expose a deeper "faith" (foi) which runs beneath the "confessional beliefs" (croyances), where both "theism" and "atheism" are treated as croyances, while faith has to do with a deep-set affirmation or desire of something we desire with a desire beyond desire, a desire that overtakes us all, theists, atheists or still trying to decide.

I think, and Watkin seems to agree, that there are no non-circular arguments against the existence of God, if by God we mean a being outside space and time. If that is what a radical atheism would mean, there is no such thing (243, n.3). What resources could we ever marshal to show what there is not in a world beyond space and time? If it is "difficult" enough to try to prove that something is there, it is even harder to prove there is not. But I do think that the good old God of St. Augustine and his two-worlds theory has run its course, that it has earned our "incredulity," to stick with Lyotard's precisely chosen word, an incredulity that is very often found among the theologians themselves. That, however, is a long way from giving up on God, or more precisely on the name (of) "God," or more precisely still the "events" that take place in and under the name (of) "God." Pursuing what I call a "radical theology," I want to be "after" God in as many ways as possible, not only after/post the dualism of The City of God but also after/ad the name of God that gives words to a desire beyond desire, which Derrida has subtly if enigmatically set loose in texts like "Circumfession." This eccentric restaging of Augustine's Confessions is a deeply nuanced deconstruction of Christianity and even more so of his own Judaism, "haunting" the religious beliefs it repeats, making them tremble while also suggesting they contain something they cannot contain. Deconstruction is not "critique" but an oblique affirmation. Derrida does not try to "occupy" the Confessions like a conquering colonial army but to "repeat" religion "without religion," according to the subtle logic of the sans, thereby exposing the structure of a more profound foi that is going on in the Confessions while not being held captive by its doctrinal croyances. Deconstruction is not "occupying;" it is reading, slowly and meticulously.

Once the binarity of theism and atheism is displaced, once the grip of these "-isms" is broken, then thinking and acting after God can begin, as free from theism as from atheism, but also, pace Watkin, as free from atheism as from theism.