Dignity: A History

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Remy Debes (ed.), Dignity: A History, Oxford University Press, 2017, 408pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199286000.

Reviewed by Y. Michael Barilan, Sackler School of Medicine, Tel Aviv University


Dignity is one of the building blocks of our human abstract vocabulary. Like love, friendship, hope and faith, it is a cluster concept (philosophically) and a very thick concept (anthropologically) whose nebulous core is ubiquitous in all known human cultures. At a certain moment in the history of ideas, dignity became attached to "humanity", and acquired a foundational moral value. It happened in the Jewish Bible and in Stoic philosophy. Christianity taught that original sin blemished human dignity and that only Christian grace offers some restoration. For many centuries, this move rendered dignity or Imago Dei irrelevant as a moral property of all humans. People were expected to behave with dignity and to accept the grace of the Church and her teachings; but they did not hear about any treatment owed them solely because all human beings had dignity.

The notion of "the" or "a" dignity of man surfaced in the Renaissance, and later, in Kant's influential philosophy. The meaning might not have always been the same, but the term has persisted. Interactions with the indigenous people of the New World required European law and theology to come to grips with the moral and legal status of real humans, a sharp departure from the medieval discourse on "monstrous" races and people. In the nineteenth century, "dignity" was a motivating theme in the Latin American struggle for independence from Spanish colonialism. In 1945, four countries mentioned "dignity" in their constitutions. In 1948, the UN Declaration of Human Rights celebrated "human dignity" as its foundational value. By the end of the millennium, over 150 countries incorporated human dignity in their constitutional law. About ten years ago, an unprecedented wave of scholarly books on human dignity in ethics, bioethics, political theory and law began rising. The book under review is among them, placing explicit emphasis on the history of human dignity and commissioning essays by authors with "expertise in each of the historical periods it examines" (p. 11).

The book's eleven chapters (some are accompanied by short commentaries) are ordered chronologically, from ancient Greece to the nineteenth century. The twentieth century is represented by a chapter on "early Africana philosophy". Even within the scope of "Africana", the book is silent on the thinking and activism of Martin Luther King Jr., Malcolm X and Franz Fanon, each of whom placed "dignity" at the heart of his philosophy, although with different meanings.

The chapter on the nineteenth century by Mika LaVaque-Manty opens with a discussion of the duel culture of German students, who considered fighting with Jews below their dignity. Next there is an analysis of dignity in the novels of Anthony Trollope. The chapter moves on to a short discussion of Wollstonecraft, who construed dignity in terms of mental strength and stamina. Finally, there is a discussion of socialism.

 Of all the topics covered in this chapter, only Pope Leo XIII's 1891 Encyclical Rerum Novarum is of lasting significance for the history of dignity. In his response to socialism, the Pope made three points about dignity that LaVaque-Manty seems to have either missed or conflated:

  1. Labor is dignified regardless of the question of control over the means of production. Whereas the nobility and the educated classes tended to belittle manual labor, the Pope invoked the old monastic tradition of labor, of spiritual men and women having "dirt under their fingernails". In this sense dignity is a kind of honor, a matter of culturally constructed status. This kind of dignity is separable from "human dignity".
  2. Christian dignity is understood in terms of the traditional Catholic teachings associating the grace of baptism with a partial healing of the damage inflicted by original sin on the Imago Dei.
  3. For the first time ever, in some places in the encyclical, a Pope refers to the "dignity of human beings" without an immediate reference to Christianity. This was a breakthrough, heralding the modern period of "human dignity" as a fundamental value, regardless of any creed or sacrament.

In the opening of his chapter, Lavaque-Manty mentions Thomas Haskell's work on capitalism and responsibility, without reference to Haskell's insight that capitalist notions of responsibility for debts fostered harsh practices in the credit market (Haskell 1985). The "honor" of paying one's debts paved the way to the loss of dignity of insolvent people. Karl Marx and Leo XIII addressed this transition from pre-modern slavery to  capitalism's uncurbed assaults on human dignity. Haskell also discusses eighteenth-century "humanitarianism", but humanitarianism often clashes with dignity.

An earlier chapter, by Somogy Varga, discusses dignity in the thinking of Karl Marx.  As Varga explains, Marx refused to cast communism in the mold of moral theory and promoted his ideas as scientific. According to Marx, as long as control of the means of production is in the hands of the few, there can be dignity neither in labor nor in any other human pursuit. He held that, until the advent of communism, humanity will remain divided between oppressors (owners of the means of production) and oppressed (self-alienated, mostly miserable,workers). Christianity's promise of equality and dignity "in Christ", in the spiritual realm, was rejected as a numbing bluff.


The book may promote revisionist history or histories of human dignity. The chapter on Pico della Mirandola by Brian Copenhaver does this. But there is no stated agenda behind Lavaque-Manty's idiosyncratic choices in the chapter on the nineteenth century. Nor is there any such agenda in the overall conceptual layout of the book. There is a quasi-literal adherence to the history of the uses of the word "dignity", without much regard to the idea of dignity embodied in concepts such as Imago Dei, human nature, natural human rationality, and autonomy. This is apparent in the book's treatments of Marxism and Islam.

There is no doubt that Marx's vision of the just society is made up of the following elements: (1) provision of all basic needs to every human being, (2) social and political equality of all humans, (3) happiness through self-realization of one's potentials for worldly work and creativity, without self-alienation. Hence, it is evident that Marx formulated a vision based on the Western values of "human dignity" without using the term.  In Islam, "justice" (Adl) carries much more normative weight than in the Christian West. Much of what Westerners stake on "dignity", Muslims find in "justice". Hence, the study of the explicit uses of "dignity" in Islam (Karama) does not rise to a genuine comparative study of dignity as a foundational moral value.

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One may regard the normative extensions of the cluster concept of human dignity as having a consolidating core, on the one hand, and a vast, protean periphery, on the other. To the core belong ideas and images that have consolidated into an unconditional, immutable, fundamental, universal, moral value regarding the moral status of humans and a universal set of expectations of all humans. These include protection of innocent life, the rule of law, the capacious participation of able individuals as agents in society, respect for sexual integrity and for conscientious freedom. In the periphery are numerous uses of concepts related to dignity such as honor, valor, and nobility.

The chapter on Bourgeois Dignity, by Christine Henderson, is a very interesting study of a peripheral aspect of human dignity, a splendid piece of social history in the spirit of Keith Thomas (who is, however, not cited). But this chapter and the commentary following are concerned with specific issues -- a case study of one English periodical from the 18th century and the conventions of portraiture. There isn't even a reference to Joseph Koerner's work on Northern Renaissance self-portraiture as a means of self-reflection and reflection on the self as a human made in the Image of God; on the given human life along with its finitudes and "the originality and productive powers of the artist" (Koerner 1993, 53). When the latter faculties direct their efforts to human portraiture (rather than to eternal and perfect entities, such as angels and the heavenly spheres), the vulnerable mortal appears as a reflection of divine providence. By this logic, the artist's self-portrait exposes the Christ in his person, as an individual in his lonesome suffering. Koerner's work helps us see how human rights developed as a hybrid of protections against the worst abuses of human individuals (symbolized by Christ's passion) and of their loftiest visions (exemplified by artistic excellences). (See Moyn 2010, 212-227).

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It is possible to divide the concept of human dignity into formal and substantive elements, a distinction central to the editor's approach (p. 207). Debes's definition of dignity is purely formal (p. 209). It refers to the special standing and status of a kind (e.g. humans) and to equality, at least in certain dimensions, across the kind in question.

The value of human dignity has had three sorts of challenges. The first comes from racist, opportunist and other attitudes that either gainsay key tenets of human dignity or place other values, such as nationalism, above them. The second comes from people's liberty to pursue just a few types of dignity, such as fair competition. This results in offenses against some substantive constituents of human dignity. The third challenge comes from deliberate efforts to promote aspects of human dignity, such as social equality, that wind up violating other aspects of dignity, such as freedom.

Coping with these challenges requires attention to the substantive elements in the metaphysics of human dignity. What is worthy of appreciation and protection in a very special way? Historically, there have been three kinds of things to be esteemed in humans: rationality, free will and the human body.

Early Christianity, and even more so medieval Thomism, saw human rationality as the seat of dignity. This veneration of rationality has a parallel from Stoicism all the way down to Kant. In a few Greek Patriarchs of the Church, we find an association of Imago Dei with human freedom and free will. Rationality is generic; free will is individualistic. In rationalist inclined philosophies of dignity, we respect every human being because he or she shares a species-typical mode of reasoning. In voluntarist and liberal thought, the choices that render each man or women a little different from all others supports a moral call for respect.

Judaism, which is responsible for the idea of Imago Dei, did not link it to either of the two mental faculties, reason and volition, but to the human body, especially the sexual human body (Barilan 2009). The omission of Judaism from the book is very odd. Perhaps the contributors wanted to enlighten us with an alternative view of human dignity, one in which Judaism (or the Hebrew Bible) plays a trivial role. But the book does not discuss this. There is no sign of self-awareness of the enormity of its deviation from the prevailing paradigms in the history of ideas.

In the religious traditions of the Occident, dignity and Imago Dei have been practically synonymous. Hence, one can only raise an eyebrow at Copenhaver's comment (p. 158) that Lactantius (250-330 CE) rarely uses the word "dignity". We do not find this word in Lactantius because he used another one instead. Ignoring the Christian doctrine on the Fall, he explicates Imago Dei as the heart of his pioneering moral philosophy (especially in book VI of his Divine Institutions). Lactantius was the first open synthesizer of the Stoic and monotheistic views on dignity/Imago Dei (Barilan 2012, 57-66). As a convert from pagan-Stoic education to the Christian faith, it was appropriate for him to use the religious word Imago Dei instead of the secular expression "dignity".

The Biblical and Talmudic traditions saw human dignity as related to the embodied sexual human body, of which rationality and free will are natural parts. This rendering lacks rational justification. Indeed, the religious justification is external -- God created humans in His Image. However, the view fits well with prevailing sentiments, moral standards and laws. For example, neither respect for the rational nature of humankind nor for free will may account for the human dignity and rights of babies who are incurably ill or mentally retarded. Why should we care to dress such people in decent clothes, covering their private parts? Scholars seek to understand such practices. They wish to know how one can judge whether the appeal to dignity in such contexts is reasonable. Is prudery (=shame in relation to public nudity) rational, or is it rational to respect such shame merely because it is a ubiquitous and powerful human sentiment?

The book does not try to tackle other practical and pressing riddles related to dignity. A long chapter on Islam by Mustafa Shah does not help us understand the resistance of the Islamic States to the Universal Declaration of Human Rights.  Nor does it shed light on these states' alternative in the form of the Cairo Declaration on Human Rights in Islam (1990), along with its unique jargon of "basic human dignity" (Article 1), and the combined use of "human dignity" with protection of "the dignity of the Prophet" (Article 22).

Historians of human rights debate whether these rights are old truths rediscovered, or inventions of the twentieth century (Moyn 2010). This book does not seem to add insight to this debate. Nor does it tackle the challenge of gender in the history of human dignity, and its stifled appearance in the French Revolution. It does not discuss the French Revolution at all. Also, the complicated role of "dignity" in late twentieth century litigation on LGBT rights is left unmentioned.

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In addition to the doctrine of the Fall, Bonnie Kent explains, pre-modern Christians did not place much weight on the value of human dignity because other entities, such as angels, were dignified. However, only humans are both dignified and vulnerable. Angels need no protection from murder, rape, dispossession, enslavement and discrimination. Humans may be treated like animals, and may be treated as gods.

There is nothing new, or even distinctively human, in paying respect to the mighty, successful, and resilient. We find this in the social lives of many animals. However, at the heart of the vision of human dignity as a fundamental value is the counter-intuitive insight that humans carry dignity despite, and regardless of, either personal or species-typical vulnerabilities. Why should anybody care for a helpless and defenseless baby? According to the Psalmist who poses this question, we should care because God endows every human with "glory and honor" (Psalm 8). Jesus claimed the highest kind of social honor -- kingship, while foregoing any kind of earthly power (John 18:36). If we combine the traditional elements of substantial dignity -- rationality, freedom of the will, and embodied earthly social existence --we see that human vulnerability is the overall source of substantial dignity. In other words, we do not insist on respect for human dignity despite weaknesses and vulnerabilities, rather, they provide the justification for, as well as the need for, respect for human dignity.

Perhaps, the most interesting chapter is by the philosopher Stephen Darwall, whose 1977 paper on "appraisal respect" and "recognition respect" has framed the discussion on human dignity in analytical philosophy to this day. The chapter summarizes a career-long reflection on the topic. Derived from Hegelian philosophy and phenomenology, recognition respect is a special attitude possible only in relation to persons. Darwall combined the formal features of human dignity, inherited from Immanuel Kant and Alan Gewirth (one of the first to raise the worry that "human dignity" might be a mere placeholder) with the phenomenology of interpersonal interaction. Debes follows this path, like Darwall, paying little attention to the substantive aspects of human dignity and to the long list of practical problems involving "human dignity".

Darwall argues that recognition is about the "second person point of view", the holistic experience of a consciousness like mine active within the person who confronts me. His paper moves quickly from dignity to rights, to "bipolar obligations" as he puts it. However, whereas everything about human rights must fall within the broader framework of human dignity, many dignity-related issues are outside the conceptual and normative scope of rights. The book's silence on the history of dignity in the era of human rights does not help in this regard.

Darwall's sensitive attention to the phenomenology of encounters with the second person point of view (e.g., p. 159) raises the question of the dignity and rights of persons who are incapable of such interactions -- the very sick or very remote. Darwall writes, "to regard others socially, consequently, is to see them as sharing a common basic standing with oneself that grounds or includes an ensemble of basic human rights to make demands of one another and hold each other to them." (p. 199). Alas, this is a circular argument from formal dignity, which would apply to many social animals. Neither Darwall nor any other contributors mention the contemporary debate about whether some animals are endowed with dignity. Equality does not follow at all from a social order in which every member may accept behavioral standards applicable to all other members. Can we imagine an order of dignity in a pack of baboons?

If the "common basic standing" is a set of human vulnerabilities and potentials, then we are in the realm of the Hobbsian balance of threats. Is an order of mutual dignity reducible to an order of mutual dread? Is the vision of human dignity a mere patina on a reality of emotion and power or an emergent game changer? Is conscience reducible to obedience to the law, as Hobbes claims? Animals have body language; humans may use "deliberative deference" (p. 210) and strictly enforced rules to settle potential conflicts. Indeed, as Debes observes in an eye-opening chapter on Pufendorf, Pufendorf's formal definition of dignity as based on human sociability rests undisturbed with slavery, albeit a "noble" version of that practice (pp. 217-8).

In line with pre-modern law, Pufendorf does not endorse slavery based on racist claims, just the enslavement of war captives. He thought of social life as taking place in a domain in which everybody has an equal access to the game of power, whether they be Genghis Khan, Dwight Eisenhower or Jeff Bezos. All three rose from social obscurity and won the power game of their time. This is not a mere thought experiment. Dominion was the leading interpretation of "dignity" in the Christian world. Dismissing the intrinsic value of people's dominion over others, Christianity underscored dominion over nature. Historian Lynn White influenced environmental thinking and activism by blaming the dominion reading of human dignity for the abuse of animals and the destruction of the environment (White 1967). The absence of the doctrine of dominion from the book might be its most glaring lapse.

To sum up the doctrine of dominion in one sentence, we may say that, whereas the logic of honor encourages respect for the successful and powerful, the logic of dignity claims privileges of power to those who have dignity. A significant step forward is embodied in the preaching of Martin Luther King, who taught that renunciation of dominion over humans -- the application of the doctrine of non-violence -- is a fundamental expectation of those endowed with dignity. The assumption that humans can fulfill themselves without dominating other humans may be a logical condition for any regime of human rights (Barilan 2012, ch. 4).

Debes takes a different tack. Not seeking to trace the extensions of dignity as a normative value, he argues that the incorporation of human passionate faculties in the phenomenology of human dignity may remedy the ills of purely rational and formal conceptualizations of dignity. Debes traces the reclamation of the passionate person to Diderot and the French Enlightenment in general. On his view, Rousseau and Diderot believed that the sentiments or passions may constitute the moral worth of humans. Whereas the passions had been treated as motivational forces to be tamed and refined in the service of higher goals, Rousseau suggested that the passions have a special value of their own. One conclusion might be an alternative conceptualization of the Hobbesian social order (which is tailored as to reduce the rate of negative passions such as fear, suffering, and want), one that aims instead at increasing the number of positive passions. This might be the meaning of the passage from Diderot that Debes cites (p. 231).

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This is a book by historians and philosophers who offer insights about human dignity, within their areas of research. There is hardly any attempt to either explicate a thesis about the history of human dignity or to engage with contemporary theories of human dignity and related issues. About one fourth of the book is dedicated to European thought in the 17th-18th century. This is the strongest and most cohesive part, where the editor and the most senior philosophers among the authors display expertise and passion. In this sense, the book offers an important contribution to the history of ideas in the early-modern period and the Enlightenment, specifically in the arena where ideas about rationality and sentiment interacted with each other in a novel wave of secular, humanist ethics. In the background of it all, simmered the ashes of the atrocities perpetrated by the religious wars and the ensuing promise of a novel international humanitarian law and the concept of rights.


Barilan, Y. M. 2009. "From Imago Dei in the Jewish Christian traditions to human dignity in contemporary Jewish law" Kennedy Institute of Ethics Journal 19:231-259.

Barilan, Y. M. 2012. Human Dignity, Human Rights, and Responsibility: The New Language of Global Bioethics and Biolaw. Harvard University Press.

Duwell, M. and Braarvig, J. (eds.) The Cambridge Handbook of Human Dignity: Interdisciplinary Perspectives. Cambridge University Press.

Haskell, T. 1985. "Capitalism and the origins of the humanitarian sensibility" American Historical Review 90:98-109, 547-566.

Koerner, J. L. 1993. The Moment of Self-Portraiture in German Renaissance Art. University of Chicago Press.

Moyn, S. 2010. The Last Utopia: Human Rights in History. Harvard University Press.

Tierney, B. 1997. The Idea of Natural Rights. Scholar Press for Emory University.

White, L. 1967. "The historical roots of our ecologic crisis". Science 155:1203-1207.