Dignity: Its History and Meaning

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Michael Rosen, Dignity: Its History and Meaning, Harvard University Press, 2012, 176 pp., $21.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674064430.

Reviewed by Stephen Darwall, Yale University


Michael Rosen's Dignity is an interesting, insightful, and stimulating study of the history and uses of the concept of dignity in moral, political, and legal contexts. Its aims are not just descriptive, but also interpretive and philosophical, or at any rate, "theoretical." Rosen writes engagingly for a general audience beyond disciplinary boundaries and without the "impersonality" and "closed-borders policy" that can make professional philosophy "inaccessible" to the wider public (xiii, xvi). His method is that of "political theory," which is "prepared to allow facts into our normative reflection and use history as part of our conceptual analysis." Political theory is, he says, "the oasis where the caravans meet" (xvi).

At the same time, Rosen enters self-consciously into two areas "that are as densely populated as any region of philosophy": the interpretation of Kant's moral philosophy and "the character of moral duty" (xiv-xv). His reading of Kant on dignity, duty, and the connections between them is nuanced and suggestive, and it places Kant helpfully against the background of earlier dignity traditions in Cicero, Aquinas, Pico, Bossuet, and Roman Catholicism. Rosen's own "Kantian" ideas about moral duty, dignity, and respect are also extremely interesting, if not perhaps so original as he sometimes portrays them.

In this review, I will concentrate mainly on Dignity's more philosophical aspects. One of the nicest things about the book, however, is a lengthy chapter (Chapter 2, "The Legislation of Dignity") that includes perceptive and fascinating discussion of the ways the concept of dignity has entered into the law and judicial decisions of contemporary Europe, most notably in Germany, whose Grundgesetz begins as follows:

(1) Human dignity is inviolable [unantastbar]. To respect it and protect it is the duty of all state power.

(2) The German people therefore acknowledge inviolable [unverletzlichen] and inalienable human rights as the basis of every community, of peace and of justice in the world. (78)

Kant's claim that human beings have an inviolable dignity is clearly an inspiration for these clauses, but Rosen shows how the Roman Catholic dignity tradition is also, and how contingencies of German political history following World War II made this especially salient. This makes for intriguing issues of constitutional interpretation, as he deftly illustrates.

Rosen begins by noting that dignity has been a relatively neglected topic in recent philosophy. He discusses three different sources of philosophical skepticism about human dignity as an independent value or source of values. The first is the claim that dignity is either a "useless" or "redundant" notion, since it can be replaced by the ideas of autonomy or human rights (4-5). Second, dignity can be seen as something manifested in ("dignified") behavior or in more restricted forms of treatment ("with dignity") rather than as an "inalienable property of human beings" that "gives a foundational reason for their having equal basic entitlements" (6). And third, dignity can seem to have no "coherent meaning of its own," but to function as a "mere receptacle" for contents that are supplied by "extraneous political, social, and religious convictions" (6).

Rosen places Joel Feinberg's ideas, expressed in the "The Nature and Value of Rights," within the first camp. According to Rosen, Feinberg in effect reduces dignity to human rights and holds that "to respect the dignity of persons" means to "respect their rights -- not subjecting them to torture, arbitrary arrest, and so on and so forth" (5). Rosen calls this "respect-as-observance" (57). We respect rights, on this view, by observing and not infringing them.

I think this is a misinterpretation of Feinberg's position and that appreciating why it is can help us to see something fundamental that any theory of dignity as the source of human rights must be able to explain.

As I read him, Feinberg's central point in his classic paper is that what is essential to (claim) rights like the right not to be tortured is the notion that to hold such a right is to have the authority or standing to claim certain conduct from others against whom one holds the right. "It is claiming that gives rights their special moral significance" (Feinberg 1980: 151). Having rights gives us a place "'to stand up like men,' to look others in the eye," and make claims on them as our right (Feinberg 1980: 151). Feinberg asks us to imagine a place, Nowheresville, where people recognize moral duties, but not that anyone can claim obligatory conduct as their right. We can simply stipulate that these moral duties include everything -- not subjecting people to torture, arbitrary arrest, and so on -- to which (we believe) human beings have basic rights. Though the citizens of Nowheresville recognize a duty not to torture, they would nonetheless not recognize any duty to potential torture victims of a sort that would entail their correlative right not to be tortured.

Rosen says that Feinberg holds that "we respect the dignity of persons . . . in exactly the same way we respect the law . . . [and] the speed limit," by not violating their rights in the same way we do not violate speed limits (5). We "observe" them. We can see, however, that this cannot be all there is to respecting rights by noticing that the citizens of Nowheresville can respect laws in this sense, including laws against torture and arbitrary arrest, without acknowledging anyone's right to these things. To recognize rights to these things, we must acknowledge their authority or standing to claim or demand them.

In The Second-Person Standpoint (SPS), I argue that this makes the concept of a (claim) right a "second-personal" concept in the sense that it entails the idea of an authority or standing to claim or demand certain conduct. Concepts are second personal when they entail the legitimacy of addressing claims or demands to someone and holding that person accountable. Feinberg's point is that the idea of rights is second personal in this sense. To have a right not to be tortured, for example, is to have the authority to demand that one not be tortured, to consent, perhaps, to acts that would amount to torture were they done without consent, to hold those who torture one accountable, to demand compensation, and, indeed, to forgive (Darwall 2012). The right holder has a distinctive standing to exercise these "normative powers." These partly constitute what it is for people against whom the right is held to be obligated to the right holder not to torture him or her.

As Rosen points out, Feinberg does say that "what is called 'human dignity' may simply be the recognizable capacity to assert claims" (quoted at 5). But if we interpret this capacity as I have been suggesting, Feinberg's position is decidedly not that we respect this capacity just by "observing" rights in the sense of providing others with what they have a right to, for example, by forbearing torture. The inhabitants of Nowheresville do that without in any way respecting anyone's authority or "capacity" to claim their forbearance.

Moreover, Feinberg's account of claim rights suggests an important constraint that any account of human dignity must meet if it is to explain human dignity's power to provide a "foundational reason" for "equal basic entitlements." An adequate account of human dignity must be able to justify the distinctively second-personal character of basic human rights. I will return to this point below when we consider Rosen's (friendly) interpretation of Kant's account of human dignity.

It might be complained against Feinberg that if human claim rights themselves consist, at least partly, in the "capacity" to claim the conduct to which we have rights, then human dignity cannot itself consist in this capacity and provide a "foundational reason" for it. In SPS, I suggest that we should conceive of the dignity of persons as the idea that all persons have an equal basic (second-personal) authority to make claims and demands of one another at all -- that, as Rawls put it, to be a person is to be a "self-originating source of valid claims" (Rawls 1980: 546). If we conceive of human dignity in this way, it can provide a "foundational reason" for basic human rights, or at any rate, provide a fundamental framework within which reasons justifying human rights can be appreciated and assessed. Human rights are all and only demands that can be justified to everyone considered as an equal source of valid claims or as having the same authority to make claims and demands of one another at all.

Much of Dignity's Chapter 1 is taken up with an illuminating conceptual history of human dignity. 'Dignity' originally referred to high social status or rank and "the honors and respectful treatment that are due to someone who occupied that position" (11). Rosen marks an important and influential departure from this social or conventional sense in Cicero's De Officiis. Although Cicero sometimes there uses 'dignitas' in its customary social sense, he also introduces the idea of "the dignity of the human race." Human dignity for Cicero is nothing that could be established by conventional patterns of deference. It is the idea that distinctive capacities for self-development "by study and reflection" give human beings a "superior" "nature" to that of "cattle and other animals." The latter are motivated only by sensory instincts, whereas human beings can "learn that sensual pleasure is wholly unworthy of the dignity of the human race" and can be guided by this understanding (12). This early Ciceronian theme reverberates throughout the dignity tradition, including most prominently Kant, especially as Rosen interprets him. It finds a distinctively modernizing twist in the Renaissance thinker Pico della Mirandola. For Pico, human dignity is rooted in a human being's capacity, in Rosen's words, "to shape himself according to a range of possibilities not available to other creatures" (15).

Virtually all later uses of 'dignity' and its cognates following their original conventional status sense are decidedly normative. Aquinas defines dignity as "something's goodness on account of itself" (quoted at 16-17). That sounds like a formal definition of what we might call "intrinsic value," although Rosen points out that on Aquinas's distinctive teleological metaphysics this becomes "the value that [something] has by occupying its appropriate place within God's creation" (17). This conception is most often associated with an ideal of universal human dignity, but Rosen shows how it was also recruited for hierarchical purposes within the Catholic tradition. Thus Bishop Bossuet can speak of the "eminent dignity" of the poor within a properly ordered hierarchy (18). Something's dignity, in this sense, is its distinctive value within an ordered hierarchical whole.

The centerpiece of Chapter 1 is Rosen's subtle and careful reading of Kant. Kant's most striking departure from the earlier dignity tradition is his claim that dignity is a kind of "unconditional, incomparable" value "beyond all price" that only one thing can have (23): "Morality, and humanity insofar as it is capable of morality is that which alone has dignity" (Kant 1996: 4:435). In the language of value, this is Kant's contrast between "relative value," determined by "inclinations and needs" and "inner value, that is, dignity" (4:434-435). All relative values have (phenomenal)-inclination-determined "prices," whereas that which has dignity alone "is raised above all price and therefore admits of no equivalent" (4:434).

This evaluative distinction maps onto one in the language of imperatives and duty, as Rosen emphasizes, namely Kant's distinction between hypothetical and categorical imperatives, although Rosen doesn't quite put it this way. Relative values can give rise only to hypothetical imperatives, whereas only what has dignity admits of a categorical imperative.

Rosen stresses that Kant's idea is that it is "morality, and humanity insofar as it is capable of morality" that "alone has dignity" (21, 23). And he sees the central role of the interrelated Kantian notions of respect, duty, law, and necessitation in Kant's theory. Kant's conception of 'morality' derives from the early modern natural law tradition's distinction, evident in Suarez, Grotius, Hobbes, and Pufendorf, between "counsels" of prudence and the "command" of binding law (Darwall forthcoming). Kant explicitly characterizes the hypothetical/categorical distinction in these terms. Hypothetical imperatives cannot "command at all" but are "to be taken as counsels" (4:418). Kant's difference from the modern natural lawyers is to hold that practical reason can command (be "law-giving") itself. This is what he calls "autonomy of the will," namely, "the property of the will by which it is a law to itself independently of any" inclination (4:440).

In a holy will having no inclinations or source of motivation to conflict with pure practical reason, "reason infallibly determines the will" and the "will chooses only that which reason independently of inclination recognizes as . . . good" (4:412). It is only when rational beings are, like human beings, subject also to subjective inclinations that can resist their pursuit of what they recognize through reason to be good, that moral duty, respect for law, and necessitation enter the scene. "Duty is the necessity of an action from respect for law" (4:400). Also: "if maxims are not already of their nature in agreement with this objective principle of rational beings as givers of universal law, the necessity of an action in accordance with the principle is called practical necessitation, that is, duty" (4:434; see also 6:222). Although holy wills are, like any rational being, subject to what Kant calls practical laws or "necessities," they are not subject to necessitation, neither do they observe the practical law out of respect (an a priori feeling that arises when recognition of the law "thwarts" or "restricts" subjective inclinations and self-love or "humiliates" or "strikes down self-conceit" (the fantasy that one is oneself, the source of the law)) (5:73).

Rosen's interpretation centers on Kant's claim that "morality" itself and "humanity insofar as it is capable of morality" alone has dignity. Kant speaks of the "the sublimity and inner dignity of the command in a duty" (4:425).

the lawgiving itself, which determines all worth, must for that very reason have a dignity, that is, an unconditional, incomparable worth; and the word respect alone provides a becoming expression for the estimate of it that a rational being must give (4:436).

"Autonomy," he concludes, "is therefore the ground of the dignity of human nature and of every rational nature" (4:436).

Humanity, and so human beings, are ends in themselves. But it is morality in the sense we have been exploring that is "the condition under which alone a rational being can be an end in itself" (4:435). Morality in this sense involves necessitation and respect for law, that is, it involves rational beings who are subject also to subjective inclinations, such as human beings, "imposing" the practical law on themselves when it conflicts with inclination.

Kant concludes The Critique of Practical Reason with the following famous observation:

Two things fill the mind with ever new and increasing admiration and reverence, the more often and more steadily one reflects on them: the starry heavens above me and the moral law within me (5:161).

Rosen shows how Kant situates his idea within a late eighteenth-century aesthetic of dignity and the sublime, as in "the sublimity and inner dignity of the command in a duty" (4:425). The notion of the sublime in this tradition, as in Burke's A Philosophical Inquiry into the Origin of Our Ideas of the Sublime and the Beautiful (1759), is that of the object (or fitting or proper object) of astonishment, awe, and reverence. In this sense, it is, for Kant, the moral law that has sublimity and dignity and is the proper object of reverence or respect. But an important part of the tradition that Kant is also affirming is that imposing the law on oneself and guiding oneself by it in the face of resistant passions and inclinations is also sublime and has dignity. This idea picks up the sense of 'dignity' in 'dignified.' Thus Kant says that we "represent a certain sublimity and dignity in the person who fulfills all his duties" (4:440).

Rosen observes that the aesthetic tradition in the background of Kant's thought is typified by Johann Joachim Winckelmann's analysis of a classical Greek sculpture of Laocoön, who dies trying to save his sons from sea serpents with as much composure and self-command as he can muster. Rosen quotes Winckelmann:

Just as the depths of the sea remain forever calm, however much the surface may rage, so does the expression of the Greek figures, however strong their passions, reveal a great and dignified soul (quoted on 33).

The underlying moral idea also finds expression in Hume and, especially, Adam Smith, in their distinction between "amiable" and "respectable" virtues, in Smith's terms. Although Hume makes the distinction first (in an appendix to the Treatise), it looms larger in Smith's Theory of Moral Sentiments. For Smith, the "awful" virtues of are those of "self-command": "that command of the passions which subjects all the movements of our nature to what our own dignity and honour . . . require" (Smith 1982: 23).

Rosen brilliantly analyzes Schiller's famous dispute with Kant over the moral value of actions "from duty," as a fundamental disagreement about the roles of grace and dignity in the moral life (31-38). For Schiller, the person who does the right thing spontaneously without internal struggle, acts with grace and "moral beauty," much as Aristotle's truly virtuous, and not merely continent (enkratic), agent. The person who overcomes the resistance of his natural impulses to do the right thing, by contrast, achieves dignity. "Just as grace is the expression of a beautiful soul, so dignity is the expression of a sublime disposition" (quoted at 35).

Rosen points out that Kant rejects Schiller's idea of moral grace out of hand, arguing that "man's fulfillment of the moral laws can be accomplished only under a necessitation" (27:490, quoted at 37). It is important to appreciate how radical Kant's claim is. In a footnote to the Religion, he writes that he "readily grant[s] that [he] is unable to associate grace with the concept of duty, by reason of duty's very dignity" (6:23, quoted at 37). The reason is that "the concept of duty includes necessitation, to which gracefulness stands in direct contradiction" (6:23, quoted at 37). Morality in the sense of being under a moral duty or obligation involves necessitation in the face of resisting impulses. Only a holy will can act with true grace. In the strict sense, only finite agents, like human beings, are subject to moral duties. When Kant says that "the moral law within" is an object of reverence, therefore, he means the law, as it appears to a human (finite) agent under necessitation through the feeling of respect.

Human beings have dignity, are "ends in themselves," because they are capable of necessitation, and so morality ("morality is the condition under which alone a rational being can be an end in itself" (4:435)). We treat others as ends in themselves when we adequately recognize this capacity in them and regulate our own conduct accordingly.

However, if this is what human dignity is, the question naturally arises, how can it provide a "foundational reason" for basic human rights? Rosen recognizes that this is a significant question. He notes that Kant "certainly thinks that it does," but says that that is because Kant thinks that fundamental among human duties is "respect for the rights of others" (55). This is true, but it cannot provide a foundation for rights if, as Feinberg argues, to have a right is to have a distinctive standing or authority that can legitimate claims and demands of others. Ironically, the very conception of respect, "respect-as-observance," which Rosen mistakenly attributes to Feinberg, is all that a fundamental duty to respect rights can provide. In order to ground rights, human dignity would have to be able to ground not just the observance of certain conduct in respect of others, but a duty to them so to act, along with the distinctive accountability that entails.

There are further problems with attempting to ground human rights in Kant's conception of human dignity, especially as Rosen interprets it, although I can only gesture toward them here. The basic problem has to do with what Kant takes rights to be and with how he derives them in the Rechtslehre. Kant holds that "right and authorization to use coercion mean one and the same thing" (6:230). In other words, your right not to be tortured is the same thing as its being true that you can forcibly resist anyone attempting to torture you without violating his rights. In the Rechtslehre, Kant grounds rights in the Universal Principle of Right: "Any action is right if it can coexist with everyone's freedom in accordance with a universal law" (6:230).

'Right' here means rightful, that is, the action does not violate others' rights. From this, Kant infers "the universal law of right" (ULR): "so act externally that the free use of your choice can coexist with the freedom of everyone in accordance with a universal law" (6:231). I cannot develop the point here, but I hope I have said enough to bring into view a logical gap that remains between, for example, whatever can make it true that one can use force to stop others from torturing one without violating their rights and what is necessary to make true that others owe it to you not to torture you, that you can legitimately demand this of them.

Rosen notes that there is a further gap between respect for rights, in general, and a "right to respect," more specifically. What is usually in play when we speak of the latter is a more specific right to respectful treatment -- to not being insulted, humiliated, and so on -- to being treated "with dignity," as Rosen insightfully puts it. Rosen has a nice discussion of the role this latter right plays in the Geneva Conventions of 1949 (58-61).

In the course of a fascinating discussion of dignity's role in Germany's Grundgesetz in Chapter 2, Rosen analyzes the Kantian background and neo-Kantian interpretations of Kant's Formula of Humanity, such as Korsgaard's and O'Neill's. As mentioned above, there is a particularly interesting account of the influence of Catholicism in post-WWII Germany and its relevance in German constitutional interpretation. Rosen describes the chasm that exists, especially, between "voluntaristic" interpretations of Kantian dignity and the dignity of persons as conceived in the Catholic tradition (87-100).

Chapter 3 is concerned with the puzzle of how to justify duties of respectful treatment that outstrip effects on any (living) person (or other sentient beings for that matter). Rosen's core example is the duty to treat corpses with respect. How is this duty to be justified? Rosen rejects "humanism" (that anything, including actions, can be good only if they beneficially affect human lives) (129-135). And he also rejects "Platonism" (that non-human things can be intrinsically good). His solution is that duties of respectful treatment (treatment with dignity) are fundamentally expressive. The right way to think of these duties in relation to Kant's idea of human dignity, therefore, is that they are duties to express dignity for the moral capacity within each of us.

The general thought that we have a fundamental duty to treat humanity with dignity and so to express respect to and for human beings in light of their moral capacity is not an unfamiliar idea in contemporary moral philosophy. Rosen says that "the idea that duties should have force absent a morally significant beneficiary seems simply too bizarre for contemporary moral philosophers to take seriously" (141). This is surprising. It is a staple, of discussions of respect, autonomy, paternalism, and the like, that respecting someone, either respecting her rights or treating her with dignity is not essentially a way of benefiting her. It is, rather, treating her "as a self-originating source of valid claims." That is why paternalism can disrespect a beneficiary.

Rosen is right that Kant's idea of human dignity, as he plausibly presents it, differs also from this Rawlsian conception, as we have been observing. Arguably, the thought that there are ways of treating corpses that disrespect the person whose body it was can be accommodated within a contractualist frame. From this perspective, the fact that the person is now dead and can no longer be harmed or benefited seems beside the point. But it may also be that a form of the thought that such treatment also disrespects the humanity that was present in that person's body cannot be so accommodated, and that this is what Rosen has in mind.

Dignity covers a vast historical and conceptual terrain in a remarkably short space. It is often insightful, sometimes brilliant, and unfailingly interesting. Philosophers and students of philosophy will read it with great profit, as will any thoughtful person.


Darwall, Stephen (2012). "Bipolar Obligation," in Oxford Studies in Metaethics, v. 7. Oxford: Oxford University Press. Pp. 333-367.

Darwall, Stephen (forthcoming). "Grotius at the Creation of Modern Moral Philosophy." Archiv fñr Geschichte der Philosophie.

Feinberg, Joel (1980). "The Nature and Value of Rights," in Rights, Justice, and the Bounds of Liberty. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Rawls, John (1980). "Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory," The Journal of Philosophy, 77: 515-572.

Smith, Adam (1982). The Theory of Moral Sentiments, eds. D. D. Raphael and A. L. MacFie. Indianapolis: Liberty Classics.