Dignity, Rank, and Rights

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Jeremy Waldron, Dignity, Rank, and Rights, Meir Dan-Cohen (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2012, 155pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199915439.

Reviewed by Remy Debes, University of Memphis


"We are all chiefs; there are no Indians" (60).

So says Jeremy Waldron in one of many pithy analogies describing his theory of human dignity -- a theory that his editor, Meir Dan-Cohen, rightly describes as "against the current" (4). That's an apt description because Waldron's central claim is that the principle of human dignity, in its juridical meaning in the modern liberal state, should not be understood in moral terms. In particular, it should not be interpreted as a doctrine about the inherent worth of persons, à la Kant, disconnected from all older connotations of social merit and rank. On the contrary, Waldron argues that within the law the principle of dignity is best understood as the assignment of all persons to a very high social rank, in some sense directly continuous with aristocratic notions of dignity once reserved for Lord and Lady. In fact, in the present age of law, even Ladies benefit from the principle of dignity. For, on Waldron's view, legal dignity entails equality: the juridical principle of dignity assigns high rank to all persons. Former slaves, laborers, bondsmen, and the rest of the run of commoners, as well as noble women (and, I guess, Indians), are all now recognized in the law, at least in principle,[1] as having something very like the status of those aristocratic men who once upon a time lorded over all. Waldron writes:

The standard status for people now is more like an earldom than like the status of a peasant; more like a knight than a squire. . . . it is the status of a right-bearer -- the bearer of an imposing array of rights -- rather than the status of someone who mostly labors under duties; it is the status of someone who can demand to be heard and taken into account; it is more like the status of someone who issues commands than like the status of someone who merely obeys them (59-60).

In short, according to Waldron, contemporary law embodies the principle of dignity through a "leveling up" of status.

I plan to dig into Waldron a bit in this review, because, frankly, I struggled to buy into his motivating arguments. In particular, I didn't buy most of his critique about the adequacy of moral theories of human dignity, which forms a crucial part of his motivating case. However, for the same reason I want to be perfectly clear upfront that I definitely recommend this book. Waldron has delivered a very important entry into the literature on human dignity. This book, which contains the revised version of his 2009 Berkeley Tanner Lectures, followed by commentaries from Michael Rosen, Don Herzog, and Wai Chee Dimock, succinctly maps crucial new conceptual space, which no one working on human dignity can ignore. And although kernels of these lectures are borrowed from some of Waldron's previous articles, this is his best and most general presentation of his view to date. Anyone working in the philosophy of law, ethics, or political philosophy will find Waldron's lectures an enriching read.

As a final preliminary, I should also say upfront that my review focuses almost exclusively on Waldron's arguments, and pays little attention to the commentaries. This is not because the commentaries aren't worth reading -- they are. But his commentators are all confessedly sympathetic, and I've already said I'd like to press Waldron. Moreover, commentary on commentary always risks becoming humdrum. I hope his distinguished commentators will thus forgive me for ignoring them here.

The "Transvaluation" Claim

"So that is my hypothesis: the modern notion of human dignity involves an upwards equalization of rank, so that we now try to accord to every human being something of the dignity, rank, and expectation of respect that was formerly accorded to nobility" (33). Thus, the concept of "dignity" doesn't simply express an idea of status -- a claim that wouldn't be novel or obviously distinct from moral theories of human worth (though later Waldron will pick on the cogency of such moral claims). Instead, "dignity" expresses the idea of a certain  status,  a status best explained ultimately in terms of the kinds of rights once only enjoyed or claimed by persons of high rank. Taken altogether, this yields Waldron's central "transvaluation" claim: the notions of 'dignity' and 'rights' are connected with the ideas of status, and connected in a way that expresses the transvaluation of historically older notions of rank.

Waldron's defense for the transvaluation claim depends on his methodology, which begins, as he puts it, with the "jurisprudence" of dignity. This is not arbitrary. He explicitly eschews a moral starting point in favor of a practical-legal one. He has a few different reasons for doing so, some of which are more convincing than others, and all of which I think Waldron could have done a better job organizing and relating. Consequently, most of what I say re-works his argument in an attempt to systematize the motivation for his theory, in order to draw out both its strengths and weaknesses. Perhaps by lumping so much attention on his motivation I could be accused of missing the forest for the trees, but I guess I don't see the point of going into the forest without a good reason. There be monsters there!

The "moral" inadequacy of dignity -- Take One

Most generally, Waldron is skeptical about the adequacy of any moral approach to theorizing human dignity. Throughout both lectures Waldron sets his defense of the transvaluation claim against the background of a hypothesis that more might be gained philosophically, practically, and jurisprudentially by dropping the assumption that dignity is essentially, or even primarily, a moral concept. Waldron argues, again and again, in one way or other, "we might do better by considering first how dignity works as a legal concept -- and then model what we want to do with it morally on that" (47). Sometimes he speaks as if the point here is the perfectly innocent suggestion that collective theorizing about human dignity could be illuminated and advanced if we do not limit ourselves to moral theory -- a claim any moralist can happily concede. At other moments, however, Waldron makes clear his belief that there are deficiencies to moral theoretical approaches to human dignity -- deficiencies the jurisprudential theory can remedy. Even bolder still, he seems to want to convince us (at least within the lectures) that we can reach an independent jurisprudential account of human dignity, that is, one divorced from moral theory. These latter skeptical claims should not be uncritically conceded.

So, are there deficiencies to moral theorizing about dignity demanding remedy by a jurisprudential account like Waldron's? One reason he thinks there are stems simply from his conviction that dignity does retain older "rank" connotations with a much closer affinity to ideas of "noble bearing" (literally, what it means to carry oneself like a Lord, assumed of special rights and protections) than with any notion of "inherent worth" or other value concept. Waldron calls these connotations "moral orthopedics" (which is a somewhat ironic label, given that he thinks moral theories fail to do justice to such connotations.) From this perspective, Waldron thinks it plainly intuitive to look for guidance on dignity from jurisprudence instead of morality because legal discourse is already saturated with such moral orthopedics (if not virtually devoid of language of "inherent worth"). This is made most obvious in rights law, which is replete with language connoting ideas like "having a certain sort of presence," "uprightness of bearing," "self-presentation as someone to be reckoned with," and so on. (21-22).

Let us grant for a moment that Waldron is right about the prevalence and even fittingness of "moral orthopedics" in the law. There are two prima facie problems with motivating his method this way. First, Waldron sets his method up as against the alternative of moral theory, but he doesn't always do a good job of articulating what exactly he takes the challenge for morality to be. Does he think moral theory simply doesn't explain, vindicate, and in turn adequately incorporate connotations of moral bearing -- that is, in the current state of the art? Or does he think moral theory can't explain, vindicate, and incorporate such connotations (at least without help from jurisprudence) because, for one reason or other, the principles of morality constitutively aren't equipped for, or are at odds with, such work? Ultimately, I'm not sure. Waldron's lectures support both readings. For example, the earlier quoted declaration that we might start with a jurisprudential analysis and then "model what we want to do with it morally on that" (47), lends itself to the softer reading. However, Waldron also implies at a few points that the domain of moral theory is the explanation of value, and as such cannot properly explain a status notion of human dignity (esp. Lecture 1.4-6). That sort of claim lends itself to the stronger reading. But let me table the latter claim for just a moment.

The other prima facie problem with Waldron's motivation as I've described it so far is that it risks begging the original question. In Waldron's mind, it is obvious that dignity is still tied up with older connotations of rank. Indeed, he argues that it is a hang up of only philosophical moralizing (as opposed to legal theory or lay morality), to keep insisting that "dignity" connotes the idea of a moral value or "inner worth." Thus, for example, Waldron endorses a bit of private wisdom he received from Joseph Raz that, "'dignity' is not a term that crops up much in ordinary moral conversation" (14). Or again, Waldron criticizes other existing accounts of "dignity," like Dworkin's, for being mere stipulation, or empty, more or less on the grounds that such accounts do not make any connection to older connotations of noble bearing. Even Kant comes in for it, in the sense that Waldron thinks we confuse Kant's view when we translate Würde as "dignity" in passages like, "what is raised above all price and therefore admits of no equivalent has a dignity" (Ak 4:435). If only we translated this as "worth" (i.e., a kind of value), Waldron thinks, we'd safely preserve the "proper" connotations of noble bearing for "dignity," i.e., as a kind of status (24).

There is some foot-stomping here.[2] After all, why should the moralist think a comprehensive account of human dignity must explain and justify the connotations of "noble bearing" in the first place, let alone take Waldron's word that such connotations are really live? Perhaps the last suggestion seems a bit perverse; and frankly, I don't really want to deny that connotations of "noble bearing" are live. But putting the moralist's question this way highlights the dogmatism in Waldron's argument with respect to whether there is a privileged connotation of dignity as noble bearing, either in philosophy or the everyday. Meanings change all the time. Unless 'dignity' today has an unambiguously univocal meaning, how can it count against a moralized use of the term if it doesn't "preserve" older connotations of rank and noble bearing? And I for one reject all these claims. I reject Waldron's assumption that 'dignity' as used today obviously connotes rank instead of inherent worth. I even reject that this usage is solely confined to etymological innovations of our contemporary era (though I won't try to defend my hunch on this point here). Likewise I reject Raz's silly suggestion -- assuming Waldron is reporting Raz accurately -- that 'dignity' is not part of everyday moral conversation. Lay moral discourse around the world baldly debunks any such claim, from protest over recent sexual violence against women in India, to outcry over garment worker conditions in Bangledesh, to (thankfully successful) movements for gay rights here in the United States.[3]

I must press one final aspect of my complaint about this part of Waldron's motivation. As I've said, he leverages the connotations of noble bearing against alternative accounts of human dignity, especially moral theories, in a way that seems to be justified only if we grant (what we need not) that such conceptual work is a desideratum of a successful, comprehensive theory of human dignity. Waldron goes so far as to say that, while terminology is always cheap, to use 'dignity' to connote a moral value like inherent worth requires us to "pay it extra" (23). But on top of the worries I've raised so far, this aspect of Waldron's argument is in tension with his own recurring self-described motive (and ultimately normative injunction) "to keep faith" with the older connotations of noble bearing. Most explicitly, Waldron states at one point, "my own view of dignity is that we should contrive to keep faith somehow with its ancient connection to noble rank or high office" (30). Part and parcel of such contrivance, he admits that the principle of dignity he's after is only now realized in law -- and even now it is an implicit ideal (roughly in the spirit of Fuller's theory that law contains an "inner morality"). It is not obvious to me how we are supposed to square these kinds of claims with his insistence on some privileged connotation of "noble bearing."

The "moral" inadequacy of dignity -- Take Two

Waldron does have a more substantive motivation, which bridges from the aforementioned challenge that moral theories can't make sense of a status notion of human dignity. Waldron rightly presses moral theories for aspiring to a status notion of dignity, if for no other reason than almost all moral discussion of human dignity is closely connected to a concept of respect. In some sense or other, respect is the fitting and deserved response of dignity (as Waldron highlights on p. 26). However, he argues, to talk of respect is implicitly to talk of status, and this is a problem. If dignity means something like what Kant is typically taken to have meant, and is a kind of inherent worth "beyond all price" (i.e., incommensurable with all other value), then "dignity" appears to be something that "eschews talk of status altogether" (47). For 'status' is a concept that constitutively connotes "higher" and "lower." It is a relational concept. More exactly, it is a hierarchical concept, even if, as in Waldron's view, there is nothing in fact there in the place of the "lower." Thus to have dignity qua status is always to imply not just "worth" but "worth over" or "worth as against." This forces an unappealing choice on the moralist: either dignity really is a status concept, and thus must be reconciled with hierarchical value schemes, which seems hard to do on any model which is supposed to place the value in question "outside" exchange (i.e., beyond all price); or it is not really a status concept, and then the moralist must justify why she feels entitled to eschew talk of status altogether, which talk is not only a highly intuitive way of getting at the meaning of 'dignity,' but also precisely what connects dignity to respect, which connection seems unimpeachably intuitive.

This is a much sounder motivation for Waldron's method. For it is, I agree, a challenge the moralist should take seriously. Indeed, I think the challenge has affinities with some of the earliest criticism of moral ideas of dignity, stretching back at least to Bernard Mandeville's Search into Nature of Society, though that's obviously a discussion for another day. Moreover, I'm willing to concede that Waldron's juridical notion of dignity has at least a prima facie advantage on this point. Given the way his theory is cashed out in terms of rank, he isn't burdened like the moralist with the need to explain how to get the connotation of status into his account. Rank just is a status notion.

But Waldron is hardly out of the woods. Actually, he only just gave us a good reason to go in! And now new problems lie in wait. First, for the same reasons pressed in the foregoing challenge, it seems to follow that Waldron's account suffers from some conceptual queerness of its own. Insofar as it advocates a status concept of dignity where there is only one status -- one rank -- one wonders whether he's really vindicated a genuine "status" notion after all. Is it enough for a concept to connote status to count as a genuine concept of status? If status concepts are necessarily hierarchical, then why isn't Waldron's really an error theory about the concept of dignity? I think Waldron takes himself to have said enough to obviate such questions, but I suspect readers will beg to differ.

Now, perhaps the foregoing questions and the lacuna they imply don't amount to an ogre in Waldron's account. But a second problem is still lurking. For there is another bit of dogma at work in Waldron's account of status -- one that I think the moralist can take advantage of. In his own effort to articulate the challenge in question, Waldron writes:

We can distinguish the ideas [of worth and dignity] also in terms of appropriate responses to value and status, respectively. The thing to do with something of value is promote it or protect it, perhaps maximize things of that kind, at any rate to treasure it. The thing to do with a ranking status is to respect and defer to the person who bears it. It is important not to elide this difference. (24)

Given this distinction, Waldron finds himself pessimistic about any attempt to non-derivatively connect a moral concept of value to status. Any plausible theory of human dignity, he essentially argues, must draw a connection to the concept of respect. Specifically, we need to articulate the grounds persons have for exacting respect from self and others. But as the passage above makes clear, Waldron simply denies that this is the conceptual purview of value. This brings me to my complaint. Waldron's argument turns on a rather flat-footed, if not dogmatic, account of the nature of respect. But within philosophy there are more than a few proposed accounts of respect that to my mind could be reconciled with a notion of moral value. One in particular must be mentioned here, namely, Stephen Darwall's well-known distinction between "appraisal" respect and "recognition" respect.

There are two reasons to turn immediately to Darwall's account. The first is that it explicitly comes under Waldron's microscope, when Waldron makes the unwelcome accusation that in Darwall's second personal ethics "dignity" qua "worth-beyond-price" is mere "decoration" -- "a wheel that turns nothing" (26). Yet, Waldron nowhere even considers Darwall's distinction of recognition respect. Of the many distinctions it is important not to elide, this has to be one of them, at least if one wants to dis(miss) Darwall. So at a minimum, I don't think we need to take this particular critique by Waldron very seriously.

The bigger point, however, doesn't really have to do with Darwall per se. At first blush his account of recognition respect purports to bridge exactly the gap that Waldron appears to worry about. According to Darwall, recognition respect, "is the disposition to give appropriate weight or consideration in one's practical deliberations to some fact about the object and to regulate one's conduct by constraints derived from that fact."[4] Couldn't the relevant "fact" be a person's dignity, or inherent worth, or whatever that worth is substantively equated with, say, autonomy?

Now perhaps this doesn't get one all the way to status, but if respect is as crucial to vindicating a conceptual connection between 'dignity' and 'status' as Waldron suggests (and I'm inclined to agree), then this seems a very good start. And again, it is just a start. As I already said, "respect" is its own deep and complicated subject. It is its own monster. Waldron treats it one-dimensionally, and this simply won't do. Not if he is going to convince moralists that there is a clear advantage in pursuing a specifically jurisprudential approach to human dignity, let alone an advantage they can't live without. In short, Waldron's theory succeeds in intriguing me. But he'll need to return with some torches and pitchforks before I'm convinced it's safe to press on.

[1] Waldron is well aware how naïve this version of his claim would be in practice.

[2] There is also something misleading, given that Kant used Würde in more than a few ways, not all easily distinguishable. See Oliver Sensen, "Kant's Conception of Human Dignity,"Kant-Studien 100 (3): 309-331

[3] To be fair, in his response to a related complaint from Rosen, Waldron concedes some overstep on this score in his original argument.

[4] This is Robin Dillon's nice 2010 SEP summary of Darwall's concept, which Darwall first introduced in his 1977 article "Two Kinds of Respect" (Ethics 88: 36-49).